2020.04.14

Robert B. Brandom

A Spirit of Trust: A Reading of Hegel's Phenomenology

Robert B. Brandom, A Spirit of Trust: A Reading of Hegel's Phenomenology, Harvard University Press, 2019, 836pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674976818.

Reviewed by Stephen Houlgate, University of Warwick


Robert Brandom worked on this book for almost thirty years before its publication. The result is a rich study of the issues that are of enduring interest to him and that he takes to be at the core of Hegel's Phenomenology. Indeed, the book sets out Brandom's principal ideas in a more comprehensive way than even his influential work Making it Explicit (1994). It does not replace the latter but builds on it and must now count as Brandom's most significant contribution to contemporary philosophy.

This might cause concern to readers of Brandom not especially interested in Hegel or fearful of engaging with his notoriously demanding philosophy. There are two reasons, however, why they should not be deterred from engaging with this impressive book. The first is that it is written with clarity and meticulous attention to detail and is full of helpful reviews of the main ideas. The second is more controversial: the book, in my view, sets out Brandom's ideas rather than Hegel's, so if readers know little about the latter, they will not be at a serious disadvantage. Brandom claims to offer a legitimate interpretation of Hegel's Phenomenology and indeed to have developed his ideas about cognition and action partly through studying and teaching Hegel's great text. To my mind, however, many of the theses Brandom attributes to Hegel find their source in Wittgenstein, Sellars and Rorty -- or in Brandom himself -- rather than in Hegel. There are certainly points of overlap between Brandom's thought and Hegel's; but Brandom seems to me not always, and in somes cases not at all, to do justice to Hegel's core insights in the Phenomenology (and elsewhere in his philosophy).

Before considering why this is the case, however, I will first review Brandom's principal claims -- claims that can be understood without detailed reference to Hegel's Phenomenology. Brandom's aim is (among other things) to set out "the transcendental conditions of the possibility of determinately contentful conceptual norms" (p. 532), and the place from which he starts is the "nonpsychological conception of the conceptual" (p. 50). This is the claim that "to be conceptually contentful is to stand in relations of material incompatibility and consequence . . . to other such contentful items" (p. 666) -- relations of what Brandom elsewhere calls "material inference". In saying this, Brandom has in mind empirical concepts, rather than logical ones. The latter are also inferentially related, but empirical concepts stand in relations of material inference, because their empirical contents acquire determinacy through excluding and including other such contents. In Brandom's view, this is what Hegel means by saying that concepts are related by "determinate negation" and "mediation" (p. 58).

Brandom's next claim is that conceptual contents take two forms: subjective and objective. Their subjective form articulates what things are for consciousness, or how they appear to us. Their objective form, by contrast, articulates what things are in themselves -- the form of empirical reality or "objective facts". For Brandom, therefore, both reality and thought are "in conceptual shape" -- a view he calls "conceptual realism". Note, however, that Brandom claims no direct access to reality, but he bases his conceptual realism on what is required for knowledge to be intelligible. In his view, if we are to assert, intelligibly, that we know something, we must take it that the conceptual form things have for thought represents the way they are in themselves. This is a transcendental, indeed semantic, claim about what it means to "know", or be conscious of, something; it is not a direct claim about being itself. Note that conceptual realism does not explain how knowing subjects come to distinguish what is real from what is mere appearance (from their perspective). It is simply the thesis that subjective and objective conceptual contents must be understood as "the two poles of the intentional nexus" (p. 666).

Brandom goes on to argue that conceptual contents in both forms are modally articulated. This is the thesis he names, rather inelegantly, "bimodal hylomorphic conceptual realism" (p. 108). On the objective side, therefore, incompatible contents -- such as "being a mammal" and "being a reptile" -- cannot be conjoined in one object, whereas consequential relations between contents -- such as "being a mammal" and "being a vertebrate" -- must hold. Brandom calls these relations between objective conceptual contents "alethic modal relations of incompatibility and consequence" (p. 60). On the subjective side, one can take an animal to be both a mammal and a reptile -- because we can get things wrong, and because we are (at least to some extent) free beings -- but we ought not to do so. By contrast, we ought to take a mammal to be a vertebrate, whether we do so or not: "one is committed or obliged to do so" (p. 668). Brandom calls these relations between subjective conceptual contents "deontic normative relations" of incompatibility and consequence (pp. 59-61). Note that objective inferentially related concepts exercise an authority over our subjective conceptions, to which, Brandom says, we are "responsible". Such concepts thus act as norms governing our subjective thoughts. In this sense, Brandom contends (following Kant, as he understands him), all cognition and representation is normative: "something counts as a representing in virtue of being responsible to something else, which counts as represented by it in virtue of exercising authority over the representing by serving as a standard for assessments of its correctness as a representing" (p. 685).

Brandom maintains, indeed, that we cannot understand objective conceptual contents without understanding the way they govern, normatively, our subjective thinking of them -- the way they oblige us to avoid incompatible commitments and draw consequences. This does not mean that the world cannot have an objective conceptual structure unless we are there to understand it: that structure is not "reference-dependent" on our understanding of it. Brandom's claim is, rather, that the two are "sense-dependent" on one another. His thesis, which he calls "objective idealism", is thus that

we cannot understand the ontological structure of the objective world . . . except in terms that make essential reference to what subjects have to do in order to count as taking the world to have that structure -- even though the world could have that structure in the absence of any subjects and their epistemic activities. (p. 670)

Note that Brandom's objective idealism is not at odds with his conceptual realism, but follows from it. Conceptual realism states that objective and subjective conceptual contents are the two poles of one "intentional nexus", the two sides of cognition. They must, therefore, be understood in relation to one another; and that in turn means that the objective side must be conceived in terms of what it obliges the subject to do, if the subject is to count as knowing it.

Brandom is interested, however, not just in the relation between objective and subjective conceptual contents, but also in the relations between different normative features of knowing (and acting) subjects. In particular, he distinguishes between normative "attitudes" (doing something) and normative "statuses" (being or having something). The latter include being committed to, or "responsible" to, a concept or norm; the former include attributing such statuses to others or acknowledging them in oneself (p. 709). Brandom's "pragmatist" claim is that normative statuses are not just things we are found to have, but are established or "instituted" by our normative attitudes and practices. So we are not born responsible, but we become responsible by taking ourselves and others to be so. Yet once instituted, normative statuses (and the norms to which they are directed) bind us and require us to do certain things: to make these judgements or carry out these actions. Our normative activity consists, therefore, in subjecting ourselves to the authority of norms we ourselves create.

Brandom adds that the normative relations between "representeds and representings" -- the things known and the knowing of them -- are "a special case of the authority of normative statuses over attitudes" (p. 753). Claiming to know something, therefore, is attributing a certain status to ourselves -- the status of being bound by what we know. Yet this status, like all others, is instituted by our normative attitudes. Knowing is thus not simply finding ourselves, but taking ourselves, to be bound by reality, and indeed taking reality to be a certain way. The empirical concepts we judge to be objective are formulated in response to "noninferential observation reports" (p. 616) -- to what we perceive -- but they are not simply read off the world. They are instituted by our attitudes and practices. This is Brandom's "pragmatism about semantics" and cognition (p. 753).

How, though, can we be bound by the norms and normative statuses that we institute? This is made possible, Brandom contends, by "a social division of labor". It is "up to me" whether I claim the coin is made of copper; but if I do so, then what I commit myself to, "what is incompatible with it and what its consequences are, is administered by those I have granted that authority by recognizing them as metallurgical experts" (p. 704). Norms are thus instituted as binding norms in social processes -- processes involving claims by some and assessment of those claims by others, as well as reciprocal recognition between the individuals concerned. This is true whether those norms govern cognition or action.

Yet this is not the end of Brandom's story, for what is also needed, if we are to establish genuinely binding norms, is a way to vindicate those we now endorse, to regard them as truly objective. We do this, Brandom claims, by retrospectively "reconstructing" the social experience that led to our current endorsement of a norm. Specifically, we have to reconstruct the past process of instituting new norms -- through the experience of error and its "repair" -- as one in which the norm we now endorse has become progressively more explicit and thereby been discovered (pp. 370-1). This in turn requires us to regard that norm as having implicitly governed our cognition "all along" and in that sense to be "objective" (p. 680). Note that such "recollective" reconstruction of experience does not give us direct access to the "truth". It is, rather, how we come to understand ourselves now to be knowing something objective: for we regard our currently accepted norm as objective by taking it to have been found through the process of making new norms. It is through such recollection, therefore, that we justify to ourselves our conceptual realism; and the thesis that the latter requires the former is what Brandom calls "conceptual idealism" (p. 369). Like objective idealism, conceptual idealism does not claim that the world exists only insofar as we do something. It claims only that we must do something -- recollectively reconstruct our experience as progressive -- if we are to take ourselves to know the world. Conceptual idealism is thus not what Hegel would call a "subjective" idealism, but rather a pragmatist thesis about cognition.

Yet Brandom thinks that we must do more than just reconstruct past experience in this way. We must also assign an explicitly positive role to cognitive errors (and failures of action), as well as to the contingencies of perception (or motivation), in the process of making explicit, and thereby discovering, objective norms. In this sense, we must adopt what Brandom calls a "forgiving" attitude to the errors and failures of the past. Furthermore, we must "confess" that our own retrospective reconstructions of past experiences may fail to make objective norms explicit, or properly to identify the positive role played by past errors and failures, and that our failures must be "forgiven" in turn by those who in the future will reconstruct the history of which we are part. Taking ourselves to be discursive beings, committed to knowing what is objective (or to doing what should be done), thus requires us to be members of an historical community, stretching from the past to the future, that is bound together by the "recognitive cycle" of confession and forgiveness (p. 634).

The story Brandom tells explains how, through our social interaction and historical experience, we come to be bound by norms that we institute and they themselves become "determinately contentful". Brandom describes this story as a metaphysics (pp. 479, 634), yet concedes that it may not achieve "full expressive adequacy" and so may not be exhaustive (p. 726). He also notes that the conditions of cognition he identifies have remained largely unrecognized and implicit. He contends, however, that when they become explicit, this will, or should, lead to a significant transformation of the way we live. In particular, "when recognitive activity takes the [explicit] form of forgiving recollection, it institutes communities with the normative structure of trust" (p. 538). For Brandom, therefore, the conditions of cognition contain an implicit moral imperative: to bring about what he takes to be a third, "postmodern" age of human history founded on forgiveness and trust.[1] The stakes here are clearly higher than one might at first think.

In premodern societies, Brandom maintains, norms and normative statuses are held to be found in the world or in the nature of human beings. Such statuses thus have priority over subjective normative attitudes. By contrast, in modernity norms and normative statuses are taken to be instituted by normative attitudes, so the latter have priority over the former. Modernity, however, fails, to a greater or lesser degree, to explain how we can be bound by the norms we institute, so it slips into various forms of "alienation", for which attitudes are not bound by norms at all but are governed, for example, by natural desires or the self-justifying convictions of "conscientious" agents (pp. 543, 552). In the postmodern age -- which is yet to come -- normative attitudes and statuses will be understood explicitly to be in balance, since such attitudes will be understood to be genuinely bound by the statuses (and norms) they institute. Also in balance will be the normative authority and responsibility of individuals and the communities to which they belong; indeed individuals and communities will be explicitly bound together -- synchronically and diachronically -- through confession, forgiveness and reciprocal recognition. Such communities, as Brandom conceives them, will thus be united by a spirit of trust (pp. 621, 726). There is nothing inevitable about such communities, for Brandom, but he contends that understanding the conditions of cognition and action -- especially the requirement for "forgiving recollection" of past experience -- obliges us to bring them about. Brandom argues, therefore, that "recognizably moral norms are to be derived from the presuppositions of discursivity in general" (p. 578).

Brandom's story is remarkable for its coherence and consistency, and is intelligible without extensive reference to Hegel's work. Yet he claims that his account "make[s] explicit the most important lessons Hegel has to teach us" (p. 8), and indeed that his book offers "a pragmatist semantic reading of Hegel's Phenomenology" (p. 1). In Brandom's view, therefore, Hegel's text already makes explicit the conditions of cognition (and action) through a retrospective, "recollective" reconstruction of the experiences of various "shapes of consciousness" (such as the "Master / Servant relation"). The Phenomenology is thus itself an instance of the "recollective rationality" it reveals to be necessary for empirical cognition (pp. 631-2). Brandom's own book then reconstructs Hegel's reconstruction in what he calls the "regimented idiom" of contemporary semantics, pragmatics and normative theory, in order (as he puts it) to be "much clearer and more precise" about the issues concerned (pp. 633, 768). In so doing Brandom treats Hegel's analyses of consciousness as "allegories", through which different features of cognition or action are examined, and he omits those sections of Hegel's book he deems to be unnecessary to the story he wants to show Hegel to be telling (including those on "Observing Reason" and, most strikingly, on "Religion").

In my view, however, Brandom's reconstruction of Hegel's phenomenology is deeply problematic. It does not do justice to the project of phenomenology and its relation to speculative logic, as Hegel understands them; and the interpretations it provides of specific shapes of consciousness, though in some cases illuminating (for example, Brandom's remarks on conscience), are often questionable. I should add that Brandom almost completely ignores other commentators on Hegel's Phenomenology, and on occasion explicitly dismisses all but a "few" (without naming names) for failing to "measure up" to the standards he sets for interpreting Hegel's text (p. 118). Given Brandom's commitment to mutual recognition, this is a strange and unfortunate omission.

I cannot explain fully here why I regard Brandom's interpretation of Hegel as problematic. What follows, therefore, should be taken merely to indicate (as they say) that other interpretations of Hegel are available.[2]

In my view, Hegel's philosophy proper begins with his speculative logic, set out in detail in his Science of Logic (1812-16, 2nd ed. 1832).[3] This logic examines the fundamental categories -- such as "something", "cause" and "object" -- that belong to both thought and being. It is thus an ontological logic that, in Brandom's terms, is committed to a strong "conceptual realism"; or, in Hegel's words, it shows "being to be pure concept in itself, and the pure concept to be true being" (SL 39). The categories derived in speculative logic are pure, rather than empirical, concepts but they are "ground-level" ones insofar as they disclose what it is to be, as well as how we must conceive of being. Hegel's philosophies of nature and spirit then reveal how these categories inform, in varying ways, the natural and human worlds.

So how does Hegel's phenomenology relate to his speculative logic? Its function, as I understand it, is to lead what Hegel calls ordinary or natural consciousness to the standpoint of such logic. Ordinary consciousness assumes that it knows things (and is not just caught in a web of its own ideas), but it takes such things to be clearly distinct from itself: it "knows objects in their antithesis to itself, and itself in antithesis to them" (PS §26).[4] It thus regards speculative philosophy or logic, which claims to disclose the nature of being through pure thought alone, to be "the inversion of truth". The task of phenomenology, therefore, is to overcome the "antithesis" between ordinary consciousness and philosophy by showing that the commitments of the former itself lead logically to the standpoint of the latter. Phenomenology does so by showing that the experience of each shape of consciousness undermines the object of that experience and eventually undermines the clear distinction between thought and being as such. At that point, consciousness becomes "absolute knowing", or thought that knows being a priori through itself. Phenomenology thus presents "consciousness in its progression from the first immediate opposition of itself and the object to absolute knowing" (SL 28).

Four things, therefore, need to be understood about Hegel's phenomenology. First, it does not set out Hegel's own philosophical ideas about being or thought, or indeed about consciousness. It does not, therefore, present Hegel's theory of consciousness and its conditions, but the latter is to be found -- after speculative logic and the philosophy of nature -- in Hegel's philosophy of subjective spirit. Second, phenomenology restricts itself to describing -- albeit in Hegel's logical vocabulary -- the experience that consciousness itself makes of its object and in which that object is altered. It examines how the object appears and changes for consciousness, not what we understand to be the conditions of experiencing it. Third, the development described by phenomenology is immanent and progressive: it moves forward from one shape of consciousness to another. Any "recollection" of that progressive development thus presupposes the latter and is not the presupposition of it. Fourth, the development of consciousness is essentially a "self-completing scepticism" (PS §78), in which consciousness progressively undermines itself and its certainties, and "spirit" is thereby rendered "competent to examine what truth is" in speculative logic.

This, however, is clearly not how Brandom understands Hegel's Phenomenology. For him, that text does not merely provide a sceptical "ladder" to Hegel's philosophy (PS §26), but it contains Hegel's most significant philosophical ideas. It presents Hegel's theory of conceptual content in cognition and action -- a theory that, in its reconstructed form, Brandom himself endorses. The idea that phenomenology is a sceptical discipline that renders spirit "competent" to examine truth in speculative logic (and the rest of speculative philosophy) thus gets lost from view. Brandom's Hegel does not, therefore, restrict himself in phenomenology to examining how objects and self-conceptions are undermined for consciousness, through its own experience, but he tells us what he understands the conditions of consciousness to be. Brandom argues, for example, that if the experiences of sense-certainty are to be "determinately contentful" their contents must "exclude one another"; but he then explains that "it would beg the question against sense certainty to insist that the consciousness involved must apply these concepts" (that is, "exclusion" and "incompatibility"). "The idea is that we use those concepts just to keep track of the rich nonconceptual content that the consciousness in question, according to the conception of sense certainty, merely points out, entertains, or contemplates" (pp. 122-3). What Brandom's Hegel provides is thus not a rigorously immanent account of the experience of sensuous consciousness, but a transcendental account of the conditions of the latter (p. 532). Moreover, Brandom invokes ideas about "types" and "tokenings" that not only sense-certainty, but also Hegel, do not entertain (pp. 117-18). This introduction of external ideas may be justified in Brandom's de re "reconstruction" of what Hegel's Phenomenology is "really" about, but it appears to me to disregard Hegel's recommendation, concerning the object of sense-certainty, that "we have not to reflect on it and ponder what it might be in truth, but only to consider the way in which it is present in sense-certainty" (PS §94).

Brandom's discussion of action and intention also shows him treating the Phenomenology as expressing Hegel's own philosophical views: for he cites passages from both the Phenomenology and the Philosophy of Right, as if the two texts were (in significant, if not all, respects) of equal status (see pp. 390-404). Moreover, he sometimes selects passages from different sections of the Phenomenology without noting the specific contexts to which they belong (see, e.g., pp. 374-9). This approach, however, leads him subtly to misunderstand Hegel's conception of action (which is contained in the Philosophy of Right, not the Phenomenology). Brandom is right that, for Hegel, action is intelligible from two perspectives: the internal perspective of the agent's purpose and intention, and the external one administered by others (what Hegel calls the "right of the objectivity of the action") (p. 396; PR §120).[5] In the Philosophy of Right, however, priority is not given to the external or "retrospective" perspective on action. In "moral" action, the two perspectives remain in tension, and in ethical action they coincide, since individuals, as ethical, simply do "what is prescribed" by their situation (PR §150R); in neither case, therefore, does the retrospective view have priority. Brandom bases the idea that it does have priority on passages from the Phenomenology, rather than the Philosophy of Right (see, e.g., p. 460); but this assumes that the former sets out Hegel's own views on action and, as I have indicated, this assumption is questionable.

Brandom takes the retrospective understanding of action to provide a model for understanding cognition retrospectively, too (p. 371). Indeed, he maintains that "this notion of retrospective recollective rationality is one of Hegel's deepest and most original ideas" (p. 104). It is so important, we are told, because retrospective reconstruction allows us to understand experience as the progressive expression, or making explicit, of the norms we now take to govern (and to have governed all along) our cognition and action (pp. 449-52). Note, however, that, for Brandom and his Hegel, the progression is only "retrospectively necessary" -- "it is not the case that a given stage could have evolved in no other way than as to produce what appears as its successor" (p. 631). In my view, this may be true of the development of empirical concepts, but it is hard to reconcile with Hegel's insistence that both phenomenology and speculative logic develop through a purely immanent, forward-moving necessity.[6] Also hard to reconcile with Hegel's understanding of those disciplines is Brandom's claim that "quite generally for Hegel, content is attributable as implicit only from the point of view of its explicit expression", that is, only retrospectively (p. 416). Brandom is right to understand Hegel's thought as making explicit what is implicit.[7] For Hegel, however, what is implicit in a shape of consciousness or category of thought is what makes its explicit expression logically necessary, not the other way around. So, for example, in the Logic, self-negation, or negativity, is implicit in "something" before it is made explicit later as "finitude" (see SL 89, 101). To my mind, therefore, the idea of retrospective rationality does not play the crucial role in Hegel's thought that Brandom assigns to it. At the end of the Phenomenology and the Logic Hegel certainly looks back over the development and conceives of it as the progress of "spirit" or the "idea". But this retrospective view of the whole is itself made necessary by the immanent development that precedes it, not vice versa.

Brandom's understanding of the relation between the Phenomenology and the Logic is also, in my view, problematic. As noted above, I take the Logic to set out the pure categories of thought and being -- categories that are the first topic of Hegel's philosophy proper. The Phenomenology, by contrast, merely leads ordinary consciousness, through a process of immanent scepticism, to the standpoint of speculative logic. Indeed, Hegel states in the Logic that one can enter logic through a simple "resolve" to set aside all assumptions about thought and being and consider "thought as such", and he suggests thereby that (for some) the Phenomenology can be dispensed with altogether (SL 48). Brandom, by contrast, takes a very different view of the Phenomenology and Logic.

For Brandom, what is of principal interest in Hegel's thought is what he tells us about "the use and content of ordinary determinate empirical concepts" (p. 6). Brandom's "master strategy" in interpreting Hegel is thus that of "semantic descent" from logical to "ground-level" empirical concepts (p. 675). Logical concepts are understood in turn -- by Brandom and his Hegel -- as "metaconcepts" that articulate essential features of empirical concepts and experience, and thereby make explicit the conditions of the latter. Such logical concepts, which include determinate negation and mediation, thus play what Brandom calls an "expressive" role. As Brandom explains, Hegel's phenomenology does not determine specific ground-level empirical and practical concepts, but it makes explicit "the speculative metaconcepts in terms of which we are to understand the ground-level process of experience" (p. 720). It does so by reconstructing "a tradition of their uses" in a series of shapes of consciousness -- shapes that, for Brandom, give allegorical expression to "actual precedent philosophical commitments", some of which prove to be good ones, and some of which do not (p. 724). Phenomenology culminates in "absolute knowing" as Brandom conceives it, which is not simply thought that has been freed "from the opposition of consciousness" (SL 29), but the explicit understanding of the conditions of empirical concepts, including "the relations between recognition and recollection" (p. 464). Brandom notes that Hegel's phenomenology serves as an "introduction" to his speculative logic (pp. 413-14), but he takes its principal task to be the positive philosophical one that he identifies.

So what does Brandom see as the task of Hegel's Logic? It, too, develops the metaconceptual conditions of empirical concepts and experience, but it does so by reconstructing a tradition of "merely possible antecedents", rather than actual ones. It thus reveals "a way the final concepts could have been developed", rather than the way their actual use (and misuse) obliges us to understand them (p. 724). To my mind, however, this unorthodox interpretation of Hegel's Logic finds no warrant in Hegel's text. The Logic, as I understand it, presents the a priori derivation of the necessary categories of thought and being; on a different interpretation, it reconstructs in a logical form the history of philosophy from Parmenides to Hegel himself. On neither reading, however, does it set out a merely possible development of the categories; indeed, Hegel's antipathy to mere possibility and "the style of the 'one can'" (SL 75) makes the claim that it does so highly implausible. Yet even if Brandom were to concede this point, he would not endorse the idea that the development of categories in the Logic is a priori and necessary. He is overtly dismissive of "a priori models of what rationality must be like" (p. 659), and his pragmatism commits him to the view that any "reconstruction" of the metaconceptual conditions of cognition -- whether phenomenological or purely logical -- is open to possible revision (p. 726). From Brandom's perspective, therefore, my interpretation of Hegel is in this respect deeply misguided.[8]

Brandom is a pragmatist about all concepts and norms, insofar as he thinks that all are "instituted" by social and historical practices of recognition and recollection. This is true, for Brandom, of empirical and practical concepts, as well as metaconcepts (though the latter have a greater necessity as the proposed "transcendental conditions" of the former).[9] In my view, Hegel might be sympathetic to the idea that empirical concepts are instituted by human practices, since he highlights the active role of consciousness in forming such concepts in his philosophy of subjective spirit.[10] He is not, however, a pragmatist about logical concepts, since he understands these to be inherent in thought and being and to be derivable a priori (and to the extent that such categories are contained in empirical concepts, the latter are themselves not merely the product of social and historical "institution"). Hegel is also not a pragmatist about the main practical -- legal, ethical and political -- concepts. The concept of "right", for example, is not first established through social recognition, but is derived immanently from the free will as such, and so demands recognition before it receives it (see PR §§29-30, 36). Right is, indeed, made actual by recognition -- in modern systems of justice -- but it is the necessary object of the truly free will, whether or not people recognise this to be the case. Yet right is not a "premodern" norm in Brandom's sense, since it is not simply found in nature or given social practices. For Hegel, the concept of right is neither just found, nor just made; nor is it, like Brandomian norms, made or instituted in such a way that we come to regard it as found, as discovered (see pp. 697-8). Right is a norm inherent in and made necessary by human freedom: it is what the free will must will to be free. As far as I can see, Brandom's pragmatism about norms does not allow for this kind of norm, but they are of central importance in Hegel's philosophy.

Brandom's reading of Hegel is problematic in other ways, too, so I will conclude by briefly mentioning some of them. Further detailed discussion of them will be reserved for another occasion.

In his account of "Force and Understanding" Brandom states that "infinity" is Hegel's term for "a distinctive holistic structure of identity constituted by necessary relations among different 'moments'" (p. 218). He neglects to point out, however, that "infinity" in this chapter of the Phenomenology is the movement "in which whatever is determined in one way or another, e.g., as being, is rather the opposite of this determinateness" (PS §163, emphasis added). Brandom thus ignores the dialectical character of infinity. Hegel defines the "dialectical moment" in thought and being as the "self-sublation" of finite determinations and "their passing into their opposites" (EL §81). In my view, however, Brandom's Hegel lacks any understanding of such dialectic.

In his discussion of "normative pragmatics", Brandom appears to identify "desire" as it first appears with animal desire (p. 241), even though desire is the first form of explicit self-consciousness and "life" is initially the object, not the subject of desire (PS §§167-8). Most remarkably, however, Brandom discusses the "Master/Servant relation" without examining the fear of death, which is essential to the Servant's freedom. Kojève would not be alone in finding this to be a very strange omission.

Brandom rightly highlights the centrality of mutual recognition (and trust) to "spirit" as Hegel conceives it, but I wonder if his conception of "ethical life" quite matches Hegel's. Hegel provides his philosophical account of ethical life in the Philosophy of Right (not the Phenomenology), and a fundamental characteristic of such life is that its members enjoy various forms of shared identity (as members of families, corporations and the state). Such identities bring with them distinctive virtues that prescribe what we should do, but these virtues also constitute our "second nature" (PR §§150-1). We do not, therefore, act under the explicit obligation to do something, but we do "what is prescribed" out of ethical habit. To the extent that our activity is guided by ethical principles, we can thus say that they act through us, as much as we act in accordance with them. Ethical activity, in other words, involves a degree of passivity, of letting ourselves be determined by what is ethical, just as philosophical thought involves letting the matter at hand develop in our thinking (see, e.g., PS §58). By contrast, moral action, for Hegel, involves a strong sense of responsibility -- that I am the one who acts -- and of explicit obligation -- that I should act in a certain way (PR §§113, 117). In light of this distinction, Brandom's conception of ethical life appears to retain what Hegel would regard as a moral character. This is suggested especially by Brandom's insistence that reciprocal recognition, as conceived by Hegel, takes the form of "reciprocal authority and responsibility" (p. 559). Brandom acknowledges that each member of a community of trust "identifies with all the others", but he understands this to mean "taking coresponsibility for the practical attitudes of everyone" (p. 757, emphasis added). Similarly, he accepts that ethical individuals share common norms, but he maintains that they are responsible to such norms, rather than being formed and informed by them. This insistence on the responsibility of individuals to one another and to norms looks, to Hegelian eyes, to be moral, rather than truly ethical. One explanation for this might be that Brandom appears to regard individuals (agents, as well as objects) as ontologically primary: he states, for example, that "communities do not have attitudes, individuals do" (p. 13). Any talk of being moved by a universal, or of the "movement of the Begriff", is thus, for Brandom, really about individuals doing something in response to a norm (see, e.g., p. 774). On this view, individuals do things for reasons, they are not moved by Reason as such. This seems to me, however, to miss an important dimension of Hegelian thought and ethical life.

One of Brandom's most striking claims is that "forgiving recollection" is a condition of successful cognition and action, and when recognitive activity takes that form explicitly it institutes communities of trust (p. 538). Brandom is right, in my view, that forgiveness belongs to a truly ethical community, as Hegel conceives it, but it is not essentially recollective. It does not involve assigning a positive cognitive role to past errors or making past actions come good. Indeed, forgiveness, for Hegel, is neither essentially "backward-looking" (p. 621) nor concerned principally with actions. In the Phenomenology, forgiveness is the letting go of one's judgemental stance towards another self and thereby establishing an equality between oneself and the other, just as confession, too, is the perception and "expression" of such equality. Forgiveness and confession together thereby constitute the genuine mutual recognition that is "absolute spirit" (PS §§666, 670). In Hegel's philosophy of religion, forgiveness is the uncoupling of a subject from his or her sinful deeds. The one who forgives thus no longer holds the other responsible for what he or she has done, but releases the other to do good: "the action certainly remains in the memory, but spirit strips it away. Imputation, therefore, does not attain to this sphere".[11] In neither case, therefore, does forgiveness, as Hegel conceives it, take the recollective form that Brandom describes.

For Hegel, trust and forgiveness are essential components of modern ethical life (see PR §§147, 268, 282). Neither, therefore, belongs principally to a postmodern age that is yet to come. Indeed, neither Hegel's phenomenology, nor his philosophy proper, aims to bring about a community of trust that does not yet exist: Hegel's thought does not have "an edifying intent" (p. 753). He is explicit about this in the Preface to the Phenomenology: "philosophy must beware of the wish to be edifying" (PS §9). In Hegel's view, the practical task of building a future based more profoundly on forgiveness and trust falls to religion (which Brandom largely ignores). The task of philosophy, by contrast, is to understand the rationality inherent in what there is: in being itself, in human freedom, and in the modern constitutional state. Brandom, however, understands philosophy to be "edifying", as well as theoretical. He does so, perhaps, because he takes modernity to be fundamentally alienated (whereas Hegel sees alienation only as a danger in modernity). As a result, he projects the unalienated spirit of trust, with forgiveness at its core, into a future that may never be more than an ought-to-be. In this way, however, he risks turning Hegel's philosophy partly into a secularised religion, for which the world "has still to await its transfiguration" (PS §787). Indeed, he states explicitly that Hegel's phenomenological story is "at once a theory and a fighting faith" (p. 635). This subtle distortion of Hegel's aim, however, highlights the principal problem with Brandom's book. The book sets out Brandom's ideas in impressive detail and with admirable lucidity; but, to my mind, it presents a reading of Hegel's Phenomenology in which, for the most part, one cannot place one's trust.


[1] Brandom takes the norm that will govern such a postmodern community to be a modified version of the Lord's Prayer: "Forgive us our trespasses, as we forgive those who trespass before us" (p. 749, emphasis added).

[2] For my interpretation of Hegel's Phenomenology, see Stephen Houlgate, Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit (London: Bloomsbury, 2013).

[3] G.W.F. Hegel, The Science of Logic, trans. and ed. G. di Giovanni (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010), henceforth SL. Note that I have sometimes altered di Giovanni's translation.

[4] G.W.F. Hegel, Phenomenology of Spirit, trans. A.V. Miller (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977), henceforth PS. I have sometimes altered Miller's translation.

[5] G.W.F. Hegel, Elements of the Philosophy of Right, ed. A.W. Wood, trans. H.B. Nisbet (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991), henceforth PR.

[6] See, e.g., SL 11-12: "To display the realm of thought philosophically, that is, in its own immanent activity or, what is the same, in its necessary development . . .".

[7] See G.W.F. Hegel, The Encyclopaedia Logic (with the Zusätze). Part I of the Encyclopaedia of Philosophical Sciences with the Zusätze, trans. T.F. Geraets, W.A. Suchting, and H.S. Harris (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 1991), henceforth EL, §88: "the whole course of philosophising . . . is nothing else but the mere positing of what is already contained in a concept".

[8] Note that, in Hegel's view, some aspects of his logic may require revision, but the immanent method he follows in that logic is "the one and only true method" (SL 33).

[9] See p. 634: Hegel identifies "the sorts of doings that are the necessary background for saying or intending anything determinately contentful".

[10] See Stephen Houlgate, "Hegel, McDowell, and Perceptual Experience. A Response to McDowell", in Hegel's Philosophical Psychology, eds. S. Herrmann-Sinai and L. Ziglioli (New York: Routledge, 2016), pp. 59-64.

[11] G.W.F. Hegel, Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion. The Lectures of 1827, ed. P.C. Hodgson, trans. R.F. Brown, P.C. Hodgson, and J.M. Stewart with the assistance of H.S. Harris (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1988), p. 467.