2020.09.02

Samuel Fleischacker

Being Me Being You: Adam Smith and Empathy

Samuel Fleischacker, Being Me Being You: Adam Smith and Empathy, University of Chicago Press, 2019, 216pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780226661896.

Reviewed by Lauren Kopajtic, Fordham University


Samuel Fleischacker's book is a very welcome addition both to scholarship on Adam Smith and to the burgeoning field of empathy studies. Fleischacker brings decades of excellent and influential work on Smith to the popular topic of empathy to show that Smithian empathy (Smith uses the term "sympathy" for this capacity), with some updates, has a crucial role to play in our ethical practices. In doing so, Fleischacker offers important responses to some perennial objections to Smith's empathy-based moral theory, and to the recent critiques of empathy from Paul Bloom and Jesse Prinz. But Fleischacker does more than just delineate and defend Smithian empathy in this book; he also makes a compelling case for an eclectic, humanistic, and empathy-based ethics.

Fleischacker's argument begins in Chapter 1 by differentiating between various forms of empathy and sketching the virtues of Smithian empathy over the other forms.Fleischacker's main concern here is with two forms of empathy: "contagion empathy," associated with Hume and characterized by relative passivity to the emotions of others, and "projection empathy," associated with Smith and characterized by active engagement with the emotions of another. Fleischacker finds that Smithian projection empathy is "more promising than contagious empathy" because it is capable of producing greater understanding, and because it is more open to difference (12). But Fleischacker also finds an important role for contagion empathy to play. Returning to an analysis from an earlier paper, Fleischacker finds that Smith's allegiance to a "private access model of the mind" gets him into some trouble (17).[1] He argues that Smithian projection empathy, because it assumes that we can have no direct access to the emotions of others (TMS I.i.1.2), must be supplemented with contagion empathy. Contagion empathy provides us with the raw materials that we can use in our imaginative and projective exercises.

Chapter 2 continues this focus on Smithian empathy, reviewing the more familiar components while also breaking new ground. One of the perennial concerns about Smith's conception of empathy has to do with how the imaginative projection actually works. In TMS I, Smith describes empathy as involving the spectator's effort to enter into the situation of the other person. But in TMS VII he seems to make a stronger claim, that when I seek to empathize with you, "I not only change circumstances with you, but I change persons and characters" (TMS VII.iii.1.4, emphasis added). Commentators have wondered how to reconcile these two descriptions. Do I focus on the details of your situation, remaining myself even while trying to understand you? Or do I seek to become you? And if I seek to become you, how can I do this while retaining the separation between you and me that is necessary for understanding and evaluation?

Fleischacker's innovative treatment of these questions connects empathy with humanity, perspective, and the self. He begins with a Smithian conception of humanity, which, instead of consisting in a shared biological nature, a shared rational nature, or a shared God-given soul, consists in a common affective nature -- the capacity for feeling and fellow-feeling, or empathy. He shows that this conception of what makes us the same builds in a conception of what makes us different. As Fleischacker writes, "what unites me sentimentally with the rest of humankind is not just a disposition to have certain feelings in certain circumstances, but an ability to be aware of those feelings, in myself and others, as from a distinctive perspective" (30, emphasis original). In empathizing with another, then, I am aware of them as having a distinct perspective. Fleischacker then moves to the most innovative segment of his argument, encapsulated by the phrase "being me being you." His claim is that the connection between empathy and perspective isn't just epistemological; it isn't just that empathy allows me to recognize that you have a distinct perspective, and then, in turn, to see that I also have a distinct perspective. The connection is metaphysical: "Who we each are is intimately bound up with who we think others are -- and with who they think we are. To put the point starkly: There is no sharp line between being me and being you" (34).

This conception of identity as intersubjectively constituted informs Fleischacker's response to the question raised above, of how much like you I have to become in order to empathize with you. Fleischacker's response puts pressure on the assumption that you and I "have stable and sharply delineated perspectives independently of empathy" (34). He argues instead that part of what it is for me to have a distinct empathetic perspective is to have a perspective that is open to the possibility of change and growth, an understanding of which is shaped by your perspective and how you feel and act. And because my sense of who I am and what I can be is shaped by my understanding of who you are, "there will be no sharp line between being me in your shoes and being you in your shoes" (37). For Fleischacker's Smith, my self is inextricably connected to your self, and to the selves of all those with whom we empathize. Furthermore, our selves are bound up with our ability to imagine a notional person, the impartial spectator, and to triangulate between the three perspectives. Fleischacker's Smith isn't actually worried about how I can understand your situation and enter your perspective while remaining myself (41). Our selves are fluid and indeterminate, and they are developed and distinguished through our empathetic interactions. As Fleischacker later puts this point, "my identity, my relationships with others, and my morality are thus interwoven" (106). The warp that holds this weave together is empathy (106).

Fleischacker's reading of Smith in Chapter 2 is both innovative and compelling. Fleischacker addresses several objections to his view, and, in doing so, he engages with Charles Griswold's more critical interpretation of Smith on empathy and the self.[2] This interpretation is fully developed in Griswold's recent book Jean-Jacques Rousseau and Adam Smith: A Philosophical Encounter (2018), and serves as a strong counterpoint to Fleischacker's arguments here.[3] The dialogue between these scholars will hopefully continue, and continue to inspire other treatments of Smith on empathy and the self.

After the concentrated interpretation of Chapter 2, Chapter 3 is more disparate, updating Smithian empathy in several ways by connecting this historical concept with more recent developments in empirical research and moral theory. Fleischacker canvasses several important themes, including the connection of empathy to imaginative literature, the question of whether nonhuman animals can empathize in the Smithian sense, the connection between empathy and care, and the role of empathy in helping us to combat epistemic injustice. One topic that is surprisingly missing from this discussion is the question of whether there is psychological variation in the capacity for empathy. Does this capacity admit of variations across populations? Is it possible for a human being to lack the capacity for empathy? And if either of these are possible, what would that mean for a moral theory based, even in part, on a shared capacity for empathy? Given the centrality of empathy to the ethical view Fleischacker goes on to propose, these questions seem pressing.

Chapter 4 examines one of the most common concerns about empathy, asking whether Smithian empathy can adequately surmount cultural difference. Fleischacker argues that Smithian empathy, when supplemented as needed by a version of empathy derived from Herder's writings, can indeed bridge cultural differences. The key, as argued for in the previous chapters, is that Smithian empathy operates with a sense of shared humanity, a set of attitudes and capacities that cross cultures. Smithian empathy, with its respect for difference as well as commonality, can cut through cultural differences that pose a threat to our recognizing the humanity in others. Where Chapter 4 emphasizes the universality of Smithian empathy, Chapter 5 addresses the scope of empathetic concern and care. Fleischacker responds to another perennial objection to Smithian empathy, the concern that it is too local, leading us to favor those who are closest to us. Fleischacker acknowledges that empathy tends toward partiality, and that Smith himself defended this feature, seeing complete cosmopolitanism as an impossible goal. And Fleischacker suggests that the partiality of empathy both has its own moral advantages, and can be harnessed and used to push for fuller humanistic concern and understanding.

Chapters 6 through 8 directly address the powerful critiques of empathy pressed by Bloom and Prinz. Fleischacker has two main critical points in responding to these critiques. First, that the opponents of empathy have misunderstood and so failed to target Smithian empathy, which is not threatened by most of these concerns. And second, that the alternative proposed by these opponents -- a version of utilitarianism that has faced decades of criticism -- is hardly an attractive alternative. As flawed as they are, Fleischacker takes from these critiques "a healthy reminder that empathy alone makes for a poor guide to morality and politics" (110). With this reminder, Fleischacker begins to lay out the other components of the moral theory he prefers. His positive proposal of an eclectic, humanistic ethics includes Smithian empathy as a tool for entering into the perspectives of others, and so helping to understand what they take as harms and as goods. I cannot here examine the various components that go into this view, and, indeed, Fleischacker could write another book working through the details of the ethical theory sketched here. These chapters provide a valuable critical treatment of utilitarianism, and a provocative sketch of a theory that holds that empathy, understood as an ongoing dialogical procedure, can help us discern notions of good and harm that are maximally inclusive and free of the elitism that imperils other theories (144-5).

With his positive proposal in place, Fleischacker concludes his book with a forward-looking treatment of demonization and empathy. Chapter 9 discusses demonization and raises the question of to whom we owe empathy. Fleischacker's answer is: to all humans. He claims that demonization, as a form of dehumanization, is "the gravest possible threat to a humanistic ethic" (150). And he argues, relying on Kant's conception of radical evil, that "refusing to demonize anyone -- even the Nazis and white nationalists who themselves make a fetish of demonizing others -- is essential to a humanistic outlook" (151). Smithian empathy can help us to recognize what is wrong with the demonizer, while also ensuring that we never become them.

While I admire the optimism of Fleischacker's positive proposals, I want to raise some concerns with his treatment of demonization. First, I am concerned that Fleischacker's view of demonization and empathy is inconsistent with remarks made elsewhere in the book. Fleischacker holds that demonization is a grave threat to a humanistic ethic because it places certain persons outside of the human community, and so outside of the moral community. But earlier in his book, Fleischacker admits that there may be people who place themselves outside of that community -- the psychopath, perhaps -- and so renounce their connection to other people (30). And he also admits, in his discussion of how he defends the universalist aspect of his view, that the "extreme racists or religious fanatics who rule some people out of humanity," who "dismiss our universalism," may be "combat[ted] . . . with force, if we cannot persuade them" (86). This may be a case where the earlier statements are meant to be superseded by the later "no demonizing" thesis, but they raise the question of whether there can be exceptions to that thesis after all. Can someone, through their actions and attitudes, remove themselves from the privilege of being understood with empathy? Can a human being renounce their humanity? And if so, what does that mean for our treatment of them?

If the "no demonizing" thesis stands without exception, I have some concerns about it, and these concerns put pressure on the way Fleischacker is conceiving of empathy, humanity, and demonization. First, I wonder if it's desirable or even practically possible in some difficult cases that aren't directly addressed by Fleischacker, where I must empathize with not just any demonizer, but with someone who demonizes me. Fleischacker admits that when we try to empathize with a demonizer -- a radical racist, for example -- we are led "to a position in which we need to see what we would otherwise take as a harm in a light that makes it out to be good." And he notes that "this is not an abstract theoretical concern" (194, n. 27). But I don't think Fleischacker fully addresses how serious this concern is. Imagine a person who grows up in a stiflingly homogeneous society that holds that some aspect of that person's identity is evil and inhuman. Fleischacker's view holds that this person owes her demonizers empathy -- that she must try to understand what they believe and feel and why they believe and feel as they do. Indeed, Fleischacker claims, "finding that I cannot empathize with another should therefore lead me to wonder which of us truly falls outside the human community: which of us is the true demon" (161-2). So, on pain of finding herself to be outside the human community, our young person must engage in dialogue about the alleged 'dangers' of the relevant part of her identity, or propose "imaginative exercises" to help her bigoted interlocutors see how things look from her perspective (147). If this were practically possible, it would be highly demanding, and place special burdens on those who are already marginalized, shunned, despised, and, often, violently treated. It might also do serious damage to the self of the demonized person who is trying to empathize with her demonizer. The person in our example has to countenance the views of her demonizers, that she might not be fully human and so might deserve their dehumanizing treatment. This could result in alienation, repression, and self-hatred.

Second, I worry that Fleischacker has bundled together the concepts of empathy, humanity, and demonization in such a way that the empathetic interaction between the demonized person and their demonizer is self-defeating and potentially opposed to the goals of a robust humanism. Fleischacker's Smithian empathy is dialogic in nature -- it's an interaction between two human beings who share a common empathetic nature. But a demonizer is someone who denies the humanity in another person. This seems to mean, then, that a demonizer cannot empathize with the person they demonize, for they deny that person is capable of empathy. But it also means that the demonized person, in trying to enter the perspective of their demonizer, has to hold the belief that they are incapable of doing the very thing that they're trying to do. To accomplish this, the demonized person would have to undermine themselves in a deep way. What would a lifetime of having to empathize with your own demonizers -- think of the case of women in a deeply patriarchal society -- do to one's capacities to empathize and imagine the perspectives of others? It seems to me more likely to result in the erosion of the selves of the demonized than a change in the views of the demonizers.

In closing, Fleischacker has offered an incredibly rich and stimulating treatment of Smithian empathy and modern ethics. It is a very welcome contribution to the literature, and will surely be a spur to further research.


[1] Fleischacker, Samuel. (2012) "Sympathy in Hume and Smith: A Contrast, Critique, and Reconstruction," in C. Fricke and D. Føllesdal (eds.), Intersubjectivity and Objectivity in Adam Smith and Edmund Husserl. Frankfurt: Ontos, 273-312.

[2] Fleischacker's main source for this criticism is Charles L. Griswold. (2010), "Smith and Rousseau in Dialogue: Sympathy, Pitié, Spectatorship and Narrative." In ThePhilosophy of Adam Smith, ed. Vivienne Brown and Samuel Fleischacker. Routledge, 59-84.

[3] Griswold, Charles L. (2018). Jean-Jacques Rousseau and Adam Smith: A Philosophical Encounter. New York: Routledge.