2018.10.10

Aaron Z. Zimmerman

Belief: A Pragmatic Picture

Aaron Z. Zimmerman, Belief: A Pragmatic Picture, Oxford University Press, 2018, 179pp., $46.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780198809517.

Reviewed by Trevor Pearce, University of North Carolina at Charlotte


1859 was a banner year for philosophy and science, with the publication of Darwin's On the Origin of Species, Marx's Zur Kritik der politischen Oekonomie, and Mill's On Liberty. But few recall another book that appeared that same year, Alexander Bain's The Emotions and the Will, even though Mill himself saw it "as marking the most advanced point which the à posteriori psychology has reached."[1] Outside the history of psychology and positivism, Bain is primarily remembered for a single claim made in this book: "action is the basis, and ultimate criterion, of belief." As he argued in its penultimate chapter,

the primordial form of belief is expectation of some contingent future about to follow on our action. Wherever any creature is found performing an action, indifferent in itself, with a view to some end, and adhering to that action with the same energy that would be manifested under the actual fruition of the end, we say that the animal possesses confidence, or belief, in the sequence of two different things, or in a certain arrangement of nature, whereby one phenomenon succeeds to another.[2]

This account of belief influenced the American pragmatists, with Charles Sanders Peirce even suggesting in 1907 that pragmatism was "scarce more than a corollary" of it (xiii).

Aaron Zimmerman's book is a defense of Bain's "pragmatic picture" of belief -- more specifically, the view that "to believe something at a given time is to be so disposed that you would use that information to guide those relatively attentive and self-controlled activities you might engage in at that time" (1). Despite its unorthodox approach, which privileges rich examples and illustrative quotations over exhaustive engagement with either historical or contemporary literature, the book demonstrates that Bain's picture deserves serious consideration. As a bonus, Zimmerman -- inspired by William James -- also argues that our choice of a particular conception of belief, although constrained by "scientific theorizing," should not be determined by it (98).

I have described the book's approach as unorthodox, but this is not meant as a criticism. Zimmerman's decision to relegate "the evaluation of several rival accounts" to the footnotes makes his book more accessible to those (like this reviewer) who are unfamiliar with the minutiae of modern debates (xiv). Likewise, although historians of philosophy might lament the fact that long quotations from the works of Bain, James, and others are not analyzed or placed in historical context, they still collectively provide evidence that Bain was a subtle observer of mental and social life.

Zimmerman starts by introducing the pragmatic picture. Beliefs are dispositions to act, but "given the rough equivalence of mind and brain," they are also "those neural states or structures that encode the information" that shapes our actions (1). They are distinguished from habits by the degree to which information has been assimilated: beliefs are representations that are only "minimally assimilated"; that is, they guide actions that require attention and self-control. If these same actions become habitual, they are no longer products of belief. You can assert something you don't believe when you're not paying attention (2-3). Most complex actions, however, are at least partially guided by beliefs, in cooperation with perceptions, feelings, calculations, habits, and so on (12).

There is another pragmatist view of belief in philosophy: Frank Ramsey's idea that "the degree of a belief is a causal property of it, which we can express vaguely as the extent to which we are prepared to act on it" (23). But although Ramsey -- following Peirce -- thus arrived at something like Bain's position in the late 1920s, he also famously tied the strength of a belief to our willingness to bet on it. The latter claim conflicts with Zimmerman's picture, since the degree to which we have assimilated information is not the same as our confidence in that information (24-25). The pragmatic picture also differs from "dual systems theories," which "divide the mind into 'automatic' processes executed by system 1 and 'effortful' processes executed by system 2" (30). Zimmerman argues that although one might be tempted to associate beliefs only with the latter, they are actually involved in both: for example, we sometimes acquire beliefs by engaging in automatic elevator small talk (39).

In his third chapter, Zimmerman extends the evolutionary approach of the pragmatists, arguing against intellectualists who analyze belief "in terms of propositions 'regarded' as true or accurate." These analyses get things wrong from the start: since (a) "non-human animals have beliefs" and (b) "only humans construct sentences and sort them into truths and falsehoods," beliefs cannot be fundamentally propositional (44). Intellectualists would deny the first premise, which Zimmerman supports through a variety of examples from ethology. The crux of the matter is apparent in the footnotes, where he quotes David Velleman:

"From the fact that believing entails believing-true we have now derived two features of belief: Belief always takes a propositional object, and it regards that object as true" (Velleman, 2000, 249). On the contrary, from the "fact" that belief does not always have a propositional object, and from the "fact" that believers needn't regard anything as true in holding their beliefs, we have derived the conclusion that believing does not entail believing-true. As it so often goes in philosophy, one theorist's modus ponens is another's modus tollens. (46)

Likewise, while many philosophers deny beliefs to animals because they lack the concepts we use in attributing beliefs to them, Zimmerman turns the tables, asking why they must have the very same concepts. Even if a dog lacks the concept master, we are nevertheless "warranted in saying . . . that the dog [pricking up its ears] believes its guardian or its master or its owner or its leader is nearby. If the dog could talk, she could help us discriminate between these subtly different formulations, but she can't, so she won't." That is, rather than deny beliefs to animals, "why not instead retain our intuitive attributions and drop these supposedly necessary criteria for belief possession?" (59).

How far does this go? Does the Arabidopsis plant produce "mustard oil to defend its leafy integrity" because it believes it's about to be eaten by caterpillars? Unlike the instrumentalist, who argues that "an organism or system 'believes' something just in case it can be fruitfully interpreted as believing that thing," the pragmatist says no: plants lack the agency needed for "attentive, controlled action" (74-75). As Colin Allen noted last year in NDPR, "the functional architecture of animal nervous systems supports coordinated and unified action that integrates multiple information sources," allowing them to occupy niches "that are out of reach for plants."[3] Pragmatists take these neurological and ecological differences seriously.

Chapter 4 examines a possible objection to the pragmatist picture: if action is the criterion of belief, does that mean that Daniel Day Lewis believed he was Abraham Lincoln while on set in 2011? Zimmerman argues that no matter how deep into the character he was, Lewis did not believe he was Lincoln because he was missing certain "dispositions to inference and overt action." After all, he didn't ask about the smartphones everyone on set was using (88). Similarly, when a kid is pretending to be an elephant she doesn't "intentionally crush everything in the room, even if she believes that's what an elephant would do" (94). Zimmerman concludes that the pragmatic picture is not threatened by pretense or partial belief: "A full belief is poised to guide any attentive, well-regulated action or deliberation to which it might prove relevant. States of acceptance, assumption, and pretense are more circumscribed in their effects" (96).

The book's final two chapters are concerned with the question of whether our beliefs ought to be completely determined by scientific reasoning and evidence. I will discuss only Chapter 5, which focuses on beliefs about belief. Zimmerman asks why we should favor one view of belief over another, arguing that "the nature of belief cannot be determined by scientific theorizing alone, but must be relativized to a set of theoretically underdetermined taxonomic choices" (98). When two pictures of belief are "empirically equivalent," in the sense that they agree about folk usage as well as the relevant neural structures and behaviors, science can't tell us which picture to endorse. Nevertheless, our decision to commit to a particular picture of belief may have consequences "for the subsequent understanding of one another we bring to our interactions outside the lab and seminar room" (103). It is these consequences, says Zimmerman, that allow us to compare two empirically equivalent accounts of belief.

Although James's "The Will to Believe" lurks in the background here, Zimmerman does not engage with recent historical scholarship in the area.[4] Instead, he motivates his meta-level voluntarism with an extended example: implicit racial bias. Does one's endorsement of the pragmatic picture change the way one thinks about racist beliefs? Focusing on the example of a person who claims to believe in racial equality but acts in racially discriminatory ways, Zimmerman provides a three-step pragmatic "recipe" for understanding what's going on. First, 'chunk' the person's actions: perhaps she "adopts a more wary visage when looking at black faces than white" or "assumes a more guarded posture when in black company than white." Second, assess the automaticity of these actions: "looking wary is perhaps more automatic than a defensive posture." Third, determine the extent to which the person attends to these actions and their consequences. The upshot is that if the discriminatory actions involve attention and control, the person is properly described as having racist beliefs; as the degree of attention and control lessens, she is instead described as "believing in racial equality while construing the members of other races in a manner that belies her beliefs" (104-105).

Thus, Zimmerman suggests that we adopt a taxonomy according to which "explicit racism essentially involves racist belief (as the pragmatist defines it), [whereas] a 'purely' implicit racism wouldn't involve racist belief at all" (110-111). What are the social consequences of endorsing this distinction? Although we live in a country where "judges, jurists, prosecutors, and police are now obligated to think of themselves as dedicated egalitarians," Zimmerman argues that these individuals "should not only act on the assumption that blacks are no more dangerous than whites, but should do what they can to better assimilate this dictum into their minds." He claims that the pragmatic picture of belief "provides the best way to explain what [this stance] entails, and the most useful package in which to sell it to the parties who need it most" (112).

Would adopting the pragmatic taxonomy really make this practical difference? Imagine an employer-mandated diversity workshop in which the notion of implicit bias is introduced. In one version, the organizer tells the audience that although they do not explicitly endorse racist beliefs, in their heart-of-hearts they do endorse such beliefs, as evidenced by their discriminatory behavior. In another version, the organizer tells the audience that although they do not endorse racist beliefs, their implicit attitudes have racist consequences, as evidenced by their discriminatory behavior. I'm not convinced that the second approach would lead more people to attempt to change their behavior -- maybe the former, with its clear attribution of racist beliefs, would have a greater impact.

It's perhaps also worth mentioning that the reliability and validity of the Implicit Association Test, which Zimmerman frequently invokes as a measure of implicit racial bias, have recently been called into question by scientists and philosophers.[5] Although Zimmerman's argument does not directly rely on this test, it does depend on the pragmatic picture's ability to explain and call attention to the problem of implicit bias. It's hard to deny the basic facts: as President Obama said in 2013, "There are very few African American men who haven't had the experience of walking across the street and hearing the locks click on the doors of cars."[6] However, if we lack a valid measure of implicit bias, what prevents us from interpreting discriminatory behavior -- demonstrated by résumé name-change studies and the like -- as the result of explicit beliefs rather than implicit attitudes? If explicit beliefs are more important than scientists have thought, does this weaken Zimmerman's pragmatic case for the pragmatic picture?

As Rudolf Carnap admitted in 1963, responding to criticism by the pragmatist Charles William Morris, philosophers should concern themselves not only with the formal properties of conceptual frameworks but also with "practical deliberations and decisions with respect to an acceptance or change of frameworks."[7] Although Zimmerman, who cites Carnap approvingly, demonstrates that Bain's pragmatic picture of belief is a framework worthy of investigation, more philosophical and scientific work is needed to determine whether its acceptance would have the positive impact he promises (124).


[1] [John Stuart Mill], "Bain's Psychology," Edinburgh Review 110 (October 1859), 288-289.

[2] Alexander Bain, The Emotions and the Will (London: John W. Parker, 1859), 569-570

[3] Colin Allen, "[Review of] Chauncey Maher, Plants Minds: A Philosophical Defense," Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews.

[4] Alexander Klein, "Science, Religion, and 'The Will to Believe,'" HOPOS 5 (2015); Cheryl Misak, "Klein on James on the Will to Believe," HOPOS (2015); Jeremy Dunham, "Idealism, Pragmatism, and the Will to Believe: Charles Renouvier and William James," British Journal for the History of Philosophy 23 (2015); Colin Koopman, "The Will, the Will to Believe, and William James: An Ethics of Freedom as Self-Transformation," Journal of the History of Philosophy 55 (2017); Alexis Dianda, "William James and the 'Willfulness' of Belief," European Journal of Philosophy 26 (2018).

[5] "What Can We Learn from the Implicit Association Test? A Brains Blog Roundtable" (17 January 2017); Edouard Machery, "Do Indirect Measures of Biases Measure Traits or Situations?" Psychological Inquiry 28 (2017); Michael Brownstein, Alex Madva, & Bertram Grawronski, "Understanding Implicit Bias: Putting the Criticism into Perspective" (2018), unpublished manuscript.

[6] Barack Obama, "Remarks by the President on Trayvon Martin" (19 July 2013).

[7] Rudolf Carnap, "Charles Morris on Pragmatism and Logical Empiricism," in Paul Arthur Schilpp (ed.), The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap (La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1963), 862.