2019.04.14

Kenneth Dorter

Can Different Cultures Think the Same Thoughts?: A Comparative Study in Metaphysics and Ethics

Kenneth Dorter, Can Different Cultures Think the Same Thoughts?: A Comparative Study in Metaphysics and Ethics, University of Notre Dame Press, 2018, 276pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780268103538.

Reviewed by Ethan Mills, University of Tennessee at Chattanooga


Philosophers specializing in non-Western traditions today face a dilemma. On one hand, the virtues of encouraging non-specialists to engage with non-Western material are obvious: it enhances collegiality between specializations, opens up philosophically fertile comparisons, and creates more visibility for non-Western traditions among our mono-cultural colleagues. On the other hand, there are risks of non-specialist engagement with non-Western material: linguistic limitations, less familiarity with contemporary scholarship, lack of understanding of cultural and philosophical context, and a tendency to make sweeping pronouncements about non-Western traditions based on limited exposure.

As a specialist in Indian philosophy myself, I approached Kenneth Dorter's book with both excitement and trepidation. While Dorter is not completely new to Chinese and Indian philosophical traditions (he has published a few articles in journals such as The Journal of Chinese Philosophy and Asian Philosophy), he has been a Plato specialist for the majority of his distinguished career. In this book, he offers a mix of the worthwhile and the problematic that serves to deepen the dilemma mentioned above. In what follows I will focus on the book's worthwhile aspects while summarizing its contents, leaving most of my critical comments for the end.

Dorter has two aims here: one, to explore ways in which metaphysics might be a foundation for ethics, and two, "to consider how far authors from different cultures can be said to have comparable views" (p. ix). The introduction lays out the project of comparative philosophy as Dorter will engage in it, suggesting that there may be inductive evidence for philosophers in different traditions having the same thoughts, or at least similar thoughts (he returns to this question in the conclusion). He also makes a number of general comments on the three traditions considered -- Chinese, Western, and Indian -- comments about which I will have more to say later.

Chapter 1, on the ancient Chinese philosopher Zhuangzi and the early Indian texts the Upaniṣads, and chapter 2, on Parmenides, Śaṅkara, and Spinoza, are treatments of the appearance-reality distinction as a general metaphysical issue: given that most people take empirical experience as the measure of what is real, why would anyone think either that our pretheoretical empirical opinions could be incorrect or that there could be a more fundamental reality beyond everyday experience? Chapter 1 is especially interesting both in comparing two texts seldom brought together, but also as a comparative study not rooted in a Western figure, a direction in which more cross-cultural philosophy is heading these days. While Dorter notes many similarities in these comparisons, he notes a number of key differences as well: for instance, while he compares Parmenides, Śaṅkara, and Spinoza on issues such as God, knowledge, freedom, and immortality, he notes that for Spinoza the distinction between thought and extension is not ultimately illusory as it is for both Parmenides and Śaṅkara, at least on the interpretations Dorter presents here (pp. 58-59).

Chapter 3 compares Zhu Xi, Plato, Aristotle, and Plotinus on the topic of whether and to what extent engaging in systematic metaphysics has beneficial ethical effects. After demonstrating some of the complex metaphysical systems of each philosopher and their relevance for ethics (and some differences as well), Dorter concludes, "For all four thinkers, metaphysics is a powerful instrument of morality, indeed the only instrument that can show us the relationship between existence and goodness" (p. 85). This chapter offers the most explicit support for the book's first aim: to show how metaphysics might be a foundation for ethics.

Chapters 4, 5, and 6 involve comparisons between Greek and Chinese philosophers and are in my opinion the most illuminating of the volume. Chapter 4, on Laozi and Heraclitus, shows how "indeterminate" metaphysics might also impact ethics. By "indeterminate" Dorter means metaphysical thinking that is relatively unsystematic in form and, in terms of content, focuses on the notion that reality itself escapes our attempts to develop precise theoretical formulations of it (p. 93). Yet, despite this indeterminacy, both Heraclitus and Laozi seem to support some practical actions over others. Both "urge upon us a holistic perspective from which we see all things as contributing elements within a harmonious unity governed by something like the good and the rational, although not in the normal senses of those words" (p. 127).

Chapter 5, on Socrates and Wang Yangming, tackles the topic of whether virtue might in fact be identical with a kind of metaphysical knowledge. This is probably the most philosophically interesting chapter, at least if one measures philosophical interest in terms of problem-solving. Dorter argues that Wang Yangming could be seen as providing a better answer to a problem for Socratic intellectualism than can be found in the Western tradition. Socrates claims (at least on a popular interpretation) that whenever a person knows what is right, that person will always do the right thing. As people from Aristotle to 21st century college students point out, it certainly seems as if there are cases where a person knows what the right thing is, but does wrong in any case. After going over some Western attempts to redefine "knowledge" to solve this problem, Dorter suggests that Wang Yangming's answer works better: for Wang, those who act in spite of alleged knowledge of goodness in fact are not in full possession of the appropriate type of knowledge, which is more like "loving beautiful colors and hating bad odors" (p. 139). The type of moral knowledge sought is "like knowledge by acquaintance, the full experience of a certain condition" (p. 141).

Chapter 6, on Confucius and Plato, focuses on the notion of an ethical mean in the work of each philosopher. Dorter shows that for both Confucius and Plato, the virtuous thing to do is often a mean between a vice of excess and a vice of deficiency. This chapter includes a fascinating section on the relation between the ethical mean and the Golden Rule (which appears in a negative form in Confucius), from which Dorter concludes that for Confucius the Golden Rule becomes a measure within the agent while for Plato it is a measure of the object (p. 167).

Chapter 7 focuses on the application of moral principles in the often messy real world, looking at Arjuna in the Bhagavad Gītā and Marcus Aurelius in his Meditations. Dorter refers to Arjuna and Marcus as "nonviolent warriors." A puzzle in both texts is how Arjuna and Marcus can put into practice the value of compassion for others found within their respective traditions while simultaneously performing the social role assigned to them (Arjuna as warrior and Marcus as Emperor). Dorter argues that in both cases the resolution of this puzzle comes in recognizing that truly violent actions are those performed with an affective state of harmful attachment and animosity. Actions performed purely out of duty can, at least with a lot of practice, be performed without these types of negative affective states.

In the conclusion Dorter returns to his two aims. He paraphrases his conclusions from the various chapters as examples of the relation between metaphysics and ethics. He also writes that, while philosophers in different traditions may not think precisely the same thoughts, "they think comparable and often compatible thoughts" (p. 199).

While there are many illuminating and worthwhile aspects of Dorter's book, I do have some reservations. First, one might wonder if it really answers its own question: Can different cultures think the same thoughts? For a book whose title contains such an intriguing metaphilosophical question, there is not much depth to Dorter's treatment of it. In both the introduction and conclusion, he walks back the idea that such thoughts could be precisely the same, but he says little about what it would mean to think the "same" thought (on p. 199 he suggests that even two philosophers in the same tradition may not be able to think the same thought). He is keen to avoid a view he attributes to Hegel and some of his intellectual descendants, namely, the idea that any similarities between traditions could only ever be superficial as such traditions are incommensurable. Dorter's point is laudable, but practitioners of cross-cultural comparative philosophy have been demonstrating for well over 50 years the many similarities -- and just as importantly, differences -- between figures in Western, Indian, and Chinese traditions. A related problem is that Dorter often relies mainly on secondary sources that are more than 20-30 years old, and his approach often seems to be the sort of old fashioned straightforwardly comparative philosophy that was popular 50-60 years ago. So, while some of Dorter's specific comparisons are interesting, he is not making a particularly novel claim about the comparability of philosophers in different traditions.

Likewise, the field has moved beyond the need to make pronouncements about these traditions as a whole, instead focusing on comparisons between individual philosophers. While most of Dorter's work is focused on individual figures, he occasionally makes claims about these traditions as a whole. Generally, he seems more well-versed in the figures in the Chinese tradition, but when it comes to the Indian tradition he perpetuates a number of false and pernicious stereotypes.

Dorter makes a number of sweeping generalizations about the Indian tradition. He claims that Indian texts are "based on myth-inflected legend" (p. 14) and that Śaṅkara appeals to "intuitions" at the expense of rational argument (p. 16). He claims that "Indian philosophy" accepts the existence of a self (ātman) hidden by illusion (māya), when this is merely the view of one particular school (p. 41). He claims that Nāgārjuna contravenes the law of excluded middle, when this is merely one possible interpretation (p. 104). Occasionally he laments how much more culturally influenced Indian texts are than Western or Chinese texts (e.g., pp. 62, 200, etc.), but he does not articulate precisely what he means by this. At one point he even acknowledges that he is not interested in the very schools that would most challenge his generalizations: the materialist Cārvākas and the intricate logical texts of Nyāya (p. 14).

By way of analogy, imagine a newcomer to Western philosophy saying that Western philosophy is generally based on poetic aphorisms rather than systematic theory-building, which this person claims to know based on having read the fragments of Heraclitus and part four of Nietzsche's Beyond Good and Evil. Likewise, Dorter's claims about the Indian tradition are based on particular interpretations of a small handful of texts, most of which came early in the Indian tradition. For readers seeking a more balanced assessment of Indian philosophical texts, I recommend the work of B. K. Matilal, one of the 20th century's foremost experts in the field.

A question Dorter's book raises for me -- and a question I hope others will consider -- is why we need to make generalizations about vast philosophical traditions at all, especially when such generalizations have historically served to marginalize the study of non-Western traditions. To be clear, I do not in any way think Dorter is acting out of ill will or intending his generalizations to marginalize the study of non-Western traditions. Yet in this case I think this unintentionally prompted question may be as interesting as Dorter's explicitly stated questions.

Despite my reservations, I do think the book makes a number of worthwhile comparisons. I hope this book will prompt other philosophers to embark upon careful, nuanced work on figures in non-Western traditions, fully aware of the potential benefits and risks of doing so.