Commentary on Plato's Republic, Volume I, Essays 1-6

Proclus, Commentary on Plato's Republic, Volume I, Essays 1-6, Dirk Baltzly, John F. Finamore, and Graeme Miles (eds., trs.), Cambridge University Press, 2018, 431pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107154698.

Reviewed by  Antonio Vargas, Hebrew University of Jerusalem

At the heart of the Republic Plato puts forth the dream of a science, "dialectic", which, by starting from an unhypothetical first principle, the Good itself, would demonstrate the starting points of all other sciences. Much is unclear about the project. What is the Good itself? How does dialectic contribute to the description of the ideal city and the nature of justice that is the ostensible subject of the dialogue? Can we find in the Platonic corpus an attempt to carry out this project?

Understanding the project of dialectic remains relevant to us today. Dirk Baltzly, John Finamore, and Graeme Miles' is the first complete translation of Proclus' Commentary on Plato's Republic. Theirs is a great service to English-speaking philosophers since Proclus' philosophy is the most systematic and ambitious attempt in antiquity to fulfill the Platonic project, especially in his Elements of Theology, the first metaphysical treatise modeled on Euclid's Elements, and his Commentary on Plato's Parmenides and Platonic Theology, where he argues that Plato did indeed carry out this project, especially in the dialectical exercise of his Parmenides.

Unlike his other commentaries, the Commentary on Plato's Republic is not a line-by-line discussion of Plato's text, but a set of sixteen essays on the dialogue. The translators put forth a persuasive case for the unity of the essays in their introduction to the volume and to the individual essays. The volume includes the first five extant essays, 1, 3, 4, 5 and 6, the second one being lost. The first essay lays down the groundwork for the interpretation of the dialogue, starting with the skopos, its unifying subject matter. What is left of the third discusses two arguments concerning justice. The fourth is on Plato's standards for correct portrayal of the gods in Republic II. The fifth answers ten questions on the art of poetry in light of the Republic. The sixth is dedicated to showing the harmony between Plato and Homer, and is divided into two books: the first one answering Socrates' criticisms of Homer's depiction of gods and heroes in the Republic, and the second arguing that Plato actually held Homer to be a divinely inspired authority.

Proclus's prose can be challenging with long sentences rich in technical vocabulary. The translators have done a good job of rendering the Greek into understandable English for the non-expert reader. The reader is assisted by individual introductions to each of the essays, an English-Greek glossary, and both a Greek word index as well as a general index. The introductions are, if anything, too helpful. For instance, in the introduction to the fourth essay the translators briefly explain Proclus' strict view of divine simplicity, according to which gods are so simple that there is no distinction between their existence and their goodness. As one reads the argument under discussion, however, it is plain that it turns on the simpler view that a participated good, that is, a good that makes something else good by its very presence, cannot in any way be evil, just as the soul which makes the body alive by its presence cannot be in any way lifeless. The reader is, of course, in no way harmed by learning about features of Proclus' philosophy that are not directly relevant to the arguments at hand.

The essays are all rich and hold surprises even for those well versed in Platonic thought (e.g. one might expect that the defining feature of the constitution of the ideal city for Proclus is that it is ruled by philosopher kings. In fact, it is the common possession of goods (9.28-10.2)). The translators, however, only explain Proclus' relevance by appealing to his indirect relevance, insofar as he encourages us to think about "the broader cultural significance of philosophy in our own time" (p.27). This seems to be selling Proclus' essays a bit short. It fails, for one, to encourage any engagement with Proclus' arguments. In order to show that translators are being overly modest, and also to introduce the reader to the richness of Proclus' Commentary, I will present a single thread of Proclus' argument, present in essays 1, 4, 5 and (especially) 6. This thread will show Proclus' relevance precisely due to how alien his views are to us.[1]

One claim of Socrates' in the Republic that is of contemporary interest to theists and non-theists alike is the claim that myths that portray gods and heroes as authors of evil are morally pernicious. Since Plato's time philosophical criticism of religion has grown and the apologist must face a legion of claims about the moral hazard posed by religious practice. Perhaps Proclus' weirdest view on the gods for contemporary readers alert to discussions on the corruptive potential of religion is his view that myths violating Socrates' injunction are themselves willed by the gods. The gods want the poets to show them behaving badly.

Mythical obscenity is part of a larger theme in the book, namely that evil itself is in one respect willed by the gods. The latter claim is already presented in the fourth essay (38.15-25), where Proclus argues that evils, and vices in particular, are necessary for the completion of the universe. This is an argument that he gives in a more expanded form elsewhere:[2] Souls are by nature rational, but they must live irrational, and hence, vicious human lives to come to animate the irrational bodies of non-human animals (via transmigration of souls), and the existence of every kind of animal is part of the perfection of the world. This is a theodicy that Proclus found in Plato's Timaeus, by interpreting the speech of the Demiurge to the junior gods (where he commands them to produce irrational animals) (41a) in light of the account of the generation of irrational animals at the end of the dialogue (90eff.), where irrational animals come to be as a result of human vice, vicious souls being reborn as beasts. Putting the two together, Proclus took the gods to give us our irrational powers for the sake of the generation of irrational animals (In Tim. III 238.29-240.6; 295.15-32), and thus saw not only bodily corruption to be necessary for the generation of new bodies, but moral corruption to be necessary for rational souls to become beastly and thus fit to animate beasts.[3] A diverse world requires people with diverse characters, and diversity (poikilía) of character is the main evil that poetry fosters in Proclus' eyes (51.20-25). "Thus even that which is evil comes from the gods inasmuch as it is, in a way, good", as he puts it (38.26-27).

This is a bleak picture of our sublunar world. Proclus quotes approvingly the "esoteric secret" revealed in Plato's Phaedo: "human beings are in a kind of prison" (85.1) since souls are in bodies as exiles from their celestial homeland (19.10ff); the world down here is like a sea "full of storms and great waves" (17.25); and the care of gods for mortals is symbolized by lamentation, for "by nature that over which providence is exercised is worthy of tears". Proclus interprets Homer as portraying just this calamitous state of affairs. The Trojan war is a symbol for "the war of souls" waged down here over sensible beauty (represented by Helen), between irrational forms of life (represented by the Trojans) and rational ones (represented by the Greeks) (175.6ff). The conflict is further identified by Proclus with "the providential care of mortals" that the Demiurge prescribes to the junior gods, that is, the creation of irrational animals through human irrationality. Indeed, he takes the speech of the Demiurge to the junior Gods to be a unified presentation of two speeches of Zeus in the Iliad (107.20-30, 165.13-166.11). The first speech is at Il.8.5-27, where he threatens the gods should they participate in the fighting, which Proclus interprets as the Demiurge establishing the gods in Himself beyond the world. The second speech is at Il.20.20-30, where Zeus urges the gods to fight, which Proclus interprets as the Demiurge's delegating to them the responsibility for creating and caring for the mortal forms of life.

Proclus is careful to observe that it is not the gods themselves that are immediately responsible for the production of irrationality. Rather, following the imagery of the Phaedrus, Proclus takes a whole chain of "daemones", spirits mediating between lower beings and the gods, to be dependent on each god. It is the very last members of these hierarchies that are the gods who go to war with each other (93.24-95.21). These daemones are said to be responsible for "the perversions of powers which are in accordance with nature, the ugliness of enmattered things, temptation towards vice and disorderly and discordant motions." (77.29-78.18)[4] And they are necessary for the Timaean reason mention above, "for the diversity (poikilía) of the universal order". The Commentary provides ample information on these spirits, giving a few examples, such as "Aphrodisian daemones governing the beauty that is manifest" (109.1-8) and the Apollonian daemon tasked with protecting Hector (146.10-23), and thus opposing Achilles, who was a model of obedience to the gods (146.17-147.2). These ultimate daemones are responsible for evils insofar as they are responsible for the continued existence of perishable kinds, and they are opposed and thus "at war" with each other insofar as they are responsible for particular species, and not for the whole (90.25ff, 92.15ff). Last, but not least, the nymphs that care for oaks (125.23-126.2) are called in to manifest the capacity of these daemones to rejoice and lament.

The capacity of these daemones to share in joy and pain is central to one of Proclus' explanations of mythical obscenity, which draws on a comparison between myths and mysteries. In the mysteries, Proclus tells us, theurgists prescribe appointed times for laughter and lamentation in order to appease the daemones, which have similar affections, and also obscene myths are read out in the mysteries for the same purpose, since the daemones have an affinity for vicious action. As the translators helpfully explain in a footnote "the lowest and most irrational kinds of daemones accept the performance of ancient verses (such as Homer) as a kind of ritual sacrifice . . . [the verses are] the ticket that the daemon-on-the-door requires to let you in to a show that's always going on", viz., the divine life that the myths and mysteries give philosophers access to. (125.23-126.2, 128.15-25, 78.18ff, 47.20-48.10)

Proclus' daemonology might easily be dismissed as implausible (or even superstitious). However, when it appears in the Commentary as an element in the rational defense of morally pernicious myths, its relevance is easily felt. The daemones' obtrusive presence in the Commentary shows that Proclus' interpretation is not simply supposed to vindicate that the myths are divine and thus that all problematic passages can be explained away. Rather, Proclus thinks that "Each myth is daemonic on the surface level, but divine according to its secret meaning." (79.2-4) The myths, too, are part of the general divine plan according to which most human beings must be irrational and go on to animate beasts, while a select few come to lead rational lives enlightened by the gods. For Proclus, the protection of the truth from profane eyes is "the special good" belonging to myths as such. )74.20; cf. 84.10ff., 205.21-23). This results in a defense of myth and rite that can resist any number of criticisms according to which religion cannot be divine because it fosters vice, for instance, the now common claim that religion encourages trust in authority and the imagination instead of critical thinking. After all, according to Proclus, myths, rites and even the abundant goodness of the world itself are but instruments of the gods, who engineer the pervasiveness of vice for the perfection of the world. (75.10ff, 104.18-25). Many theists believe that religion must make people morally better, but Proclus is a very interesting case of an apologist of myths and rituals who does not share that belief.

This does not mean, however, that Proclus neglects to defend the goodness of the gods. Far from it. In his fourth essay laying out and defending Plato's three standards for representation of the gods (they are cause of no evils, but rather of goods; they do not change; they do not deceive), he points out that daemones, which we have seen are responsible for the necessary "temptations towards vice", are entirely lacking in falsehood, for the reason that what is irrational in them is receptive neither of truth nor of falsehood (41.17-22). This becomes clearer in the sixth essay, when he states that daemones typically express themselves through images (86.10ff). Thus they never communicate an outright vicious intent in a human mind, but rather merely suggest images that the soul, of its own accord, interprets in a vicious way. The suggestion of Athena to Pandaros to break the truce is explained accordingly: she did not cause him to commit his evil deed, rather she put before him a choice, and he chose badly. Thus, although vice is necessary for the completion of the world and the existence of irrational beings, there is no compulsion to vice from the gods. Rather the responsibility lies always squarely on human souls. (Perhaps a businessman might concede that the vices of the majority of his consumers are essential to his business model, but in every case the responsibility is theirs since they continue to buy his product.) In this way, Proclus maintains the gods' goodness because "The Good is more powerful than the true" (116.6-20): for the sake of the perfection of the world the gods act not only through rational, but also through subrational means.

This presentation of the theodicy contained in the Commentary stands for the whole: for its relevance, difficulty and richness. The translators are to be commended for their labors.


Thanks to Edward Butler, David Kretz, Ron Sadan, Conor Stark and an anonymous reviewer for their comments on earlier drafts of this text.


Lamberton, Robert (tr.). Proclus the Successor on Poetics and the Homeric Poems: Essays 5 and 6 of His Commentary on the Republic of Plato. Society of Biblical Literature, 2012.

Steel, Carlos. Proclus' Defence of the Timaeus against Aristotle: A Reconstruction of a Lost Polemical Treatise in Sorabji, Richard (Editor) Aristotle Re-Interpreted. New Findings on Seven Hundred Years of the Ancient Commentators; Bloomsbury, 2016; pp. 327-352

[1] Lamberton (2012) has already provided a translation of the 5th and 6th essays. But the inclusion in this volume of the first, third and fourth essays, and in coming volumes of the rest mean indeed that now a great deal of material is being made available for the first time. For a review of the volume focusing on its merits as a translation instead of as a work of philosophy, see Lamberton's review for Bryn Mawr Classical Review. 

[2] See In Alc. 256.7-258.9; In Tim. III 238.29-240.6; 294.22-295.32, D Mal. §5

[3] But cf. Steel (2016, pp.342-3), who in his discussion of a later passage of the Republic Commentary II.333.29-335.23 denies that Proclus thinks that transmigration requires vicious souls to operate. It is beyond the scope of this review to present my own reading of this text, but I will point out that the argument that every beast needs a separate soul to be self-moved is repeated in it. On transmigration, the translators are misleading in a footnote when they explain the schesis of a human soul to an animal body as "a very intimate relation". The point of the word schesis is that it is a mere relation, and thus deficient when compared to the case of inhabiting a human body.

[4] This role of the daemones is obscured by the translators' decision to translate prostêsaménas as "reflect" at 78.3, when it should be "govern" or something similar, as they correctly translate shortly thereafter. Indeed, they justify "reflect" in a note by saying that this is how Proclus speaks of poetic images, but the sentence is clearly about daemones.