2020.03.05

John D. Caputo

Cross and Cosmos: A Theology of Difficult Glory

John D. Caputo, Cross and Cosmos: A Theology of Difficult Glory, Indiana University Press, 2019, 287pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253043122.

Reviewed by Douglas Groothuis, Denver Seminary


John D. Caputo tells us he is "coming out" as a theologian by writing this book. In this, he joins postmodern theologians such as Mark C. Taylor and Carl Raschke, the latter of whom endorses the book on its back cover. Ostensibly, the book is about Christ's crucifixion and its distinctive and radical bearing on reality and human existence. Caputo's point of departure is taken from the Apostle Paul's concept of the cross as weakness and foolishness, which is taken from Paul's first letter to the Corinthian church. Caputo likewise draws on Martin Luther's "theology of the cross," which is opposed to a "theology of glory," which claims too much knowledge about God and his ways -- more than mere mortals can uncover.

However, Caputo's concern is not with fidelity to Paul's or Luther's accounts of the cross. He wants to read Paul and Luther, but also to read beyond them. Historic creeds and confessions are not in his purview either, and he is not making a case based on the whole Bible's teachings on this matter. So, just what is he doing? That is not easy to say, but it has to do with God's insistent call to humanity to exist in the world in a cruciform way.

Caputo writes within the tradition of continental philosophy and specifically as a deconstructionist; he is influenced principally by Heidegger and Derrida. In his What Would Jesus Deconstruct?[1] Caputo repeatedly refers to his work as "radical," meaning revisionist, iconoclastic, and innovative. Deconstructionists, following Derrida, deny that written texts have determinate meanings based on the author's stated aims, the audience's concerns, and the author's cultural background. Elsewhere, Caputo says that deconstruction helps us to "shake loose from a text its essential tendencies, tendencies which the text itself conceals."[2] But this "shaking loose" forbids the text from speaking in one voice or allowing any definitive interpretation of it.

The task of deconstructionists is more hermeneutical (in a postmodern sense) than analytic. They probe and joust for new meanings to emerge from old texts as opposed to finding a fixed meaning that is then subject to philosophical analysis using the canons of reason as understood in the Western tradition. Thus, there is no correct meaning for any biblical text. Caputo wields this method (if I may so stabilize it) to address the meaning of an event at the center of Christianity. He tries to apply Derrida's method of différance to hermeneutics.

Those writing in this vein are often difficult to decipher and are not known for pellucid prose. Caputo continues this tradition with his showy wordplay, long and convoluted sentences, and ostentatious neologisms (such as hauntological, existance, and ipseity).

The cross of Jesus Christ is the lynchpin of Christian theology and the source of endless controversy. Historic Christian consensus teaches that Christ's death -- combined with his resurrection -- is somehow necessary for the redemption of humanity and even for the restoration of the cosmos. God's redemptive pattern is that he humbled himself in Christ, even to the point of suffering a horrible death on the cross at the hands of his erring creatures. But his death was not the end of the story. Because of his humiliation and death, Christ was vindicated and exalted by God through his resurrection and ascension. Having been brought so low, he can now ascend no higher, since he has been vindicated in his being and mission. As the Apostle's Creed puts it:

He suffered under Pontius Pilate,
was crucified, died, and was buried;
he descended to hell.
The third day he rose again from the dead.
He ascended to heaven
and is seated at the right hand of God the Father almighty.
From there he will come to judge the living and the dead.

I have gone on about Christian theology in order to contrast it with Caputo's account of the cross. For him, the cross only means humiliation and emptying. He recognizes that both Apostle Paul and Luther affirm Christ's humiliation on the cross in the context of his ultimate victory over the forces that executed him. Caputo will have none of that, though, since he thinks that Christ's death has not accomplished much in the observable world in the past two thousand years. We must, he asserts, resist the temptation to compromise the cross by reducing it to "a strategy we spring on the strong to catch them unawares; an economy, a good investment with long-term rewards; or a Docetism that makes the suffering and weakness an appearance behind which lurks the real action and power" (p. 4). He quotes the theologian James Cone to the effect that if Christ has brought racial reconciliation between blacks and whites someone should tell the whites (p. 8).

That is a good line, but rather glib. Consider two reasons. First, the Apostle Paul and Luther believed that Christ's death accomplished something unobservable and invisible, but eternally real: the forgiveness of sins and life everlasting for those who believe. For them -- and according to orthodox Christian teaching -- Christ reconciled believers to God through his death. Caputo does not seriously consider this idea; he, rather, concentrates on the social effects of the cross.

Second, both Martin Luther King and Bishop Desmond Tutu would disagree that Christ's death has done little to bring about racial healing in the real world, since they saw cavernous racial divides bridged through the message of the cross. The cross for King himself meant being assassinated for the cause of civil rights. As a Baptist minister and theologian, King hoped in the power of weakness but also in the vindication of God. He paraphrased Theodore Parker when he said, "The arc of the moral universe is long, but it bends toward justice."[3] President Barack Obama used this phrase in a public speech in 2009.[4]

Those whose racial animosity has been exposed and treated through Christian teaching and living would likewise disagree. Caputo's insistence that the cross has done little to heal the world fails to even consider the salutary effects of the Christian movement throughout history, beginning with the early Christians in the Roman Empire who comforted the lepers, rescued abandoned babies, feed the hungry, and more, as Rodney Stark points out in The Rise of Christianity.[5] I will not here make the case that Christianity has done more good than harm in world history. My point is, rather, that Caputo seems to think that because Christ did not usher in paradise at his first coming, his cross had no tangible salvific effect on the world. That claim needs more support than Caputo gives it.

Caputo agrees with Luther that a "theology of the cross" must deny any knowledge of God that might come through any other means than the cross itself. Thus, natural theology -- the attempt to argue for God's existence from certain facts in the cosmos -- is ruled out in principle. Caputo makes this a presupposition without asking (1) whether Luther was correct in this view, given Luther's adherence to the authority of the Bible[6] or (2) whether there might be examples of natural theology in church history or today that, in fact, give reason to believe in God without jeopardizing what the cross tells us about God. Caputo makes no mention of the work of well-respected philosophers such as Robert Adams, Richard Swinburne, William Lane Craig, or J. P. Moreland, all of whom who have engaged natural theology at the highest analytical level. Caputo seems to assume a naturalistic view of the cosmos with little or no place for God -- at least in any recognizably monotheistic sense of God as a transcendent Creator and Providence. He says that "supernaturalism' is "blasphemous" (84).

For Caputo the meaning and message of the cross is "the call of God" on our lives to side with the weak and powerless. (In this, he sounds like a liberation theologian, and he interacts with the black liberation theology of Cone, especially in the chapter, "The Cross and the Lynching Tree".) This call, however, comes without any intelligible cognitive content. It is not a call based on the known character of God, since on Caputo's extreme apophatic view, God is unknowable in terms of propositional assent. Caputo is ruthless in uprooting the idea of a call from anything dependable or understandable: "The call is neither Paul's nor Apollos's nor Cephas's -- nor that of any identifiable agent, including the New Testament kerygma" (p. 37). "The call itself, if there is such a thing, is never self-identical, always suggestive of a polyphony, a cacophony of voices, a palimpsest of calls and memories too interwoven to untangle" (p. 38). Caputo is having fun with words, but in so doing he is muting the call of anything to anyone, since there is no reliable way to know what it is. He is a kind of mystery monger, trying to cast his spell through the repeated negations of concepts and relations that are necessary for meaning and knowledge.

Because Caputo strips away any meaning from the idea of a call to do anything in particular, his view seems little different from the atheist Jean Paul Sartre's counsel to a young man to "choose, that is invent" his own moral meaning and course of action, since there is no objective authority applicable to his unique situation.[7] However, Caputo identifies the way of the cross with particular political movements that dethrone hierarchy and exalt the oppressed.

This issues in a decentering, de-colonizing, democratizing movement in the ethical, social, and political order that weakens the privilege of the "west" and builds up "the third world"; that worries about "human rights when they come at the cost of torturing animals to death for food, amusement, or trinkets; that weakens our dominion over and respects the "rights" of the earth, which is something more material for our domination. (p. 30)

There is plenty of moral content here. Nonetheless, Caputo's convictions are left ungrounded in anything authoritative, given his deconstructive and noncognitive claims about God and the call.

Caputo's deconstruction runs deep, to the very foundations of knowledge itself. He attempts to eschew the categories of existence and non-existence when it comes to God. God does not exist but insists.[8] Hence Caputo's idea of the insistent call of God. I cannot make out how Caputo can affirm the nonexistence of God while claiming God does something. It is simply illogical. For any concept to be identified, it must have discernible properties. A square must have four sides. A unicorn must be a horse with one horn. For any concept about an entity, we rightly ask whether it exists. To put another way, we ask whether the concept of that entity is instantiated. Thus, there are many square things (like a Rubik's cube), but -- as far as we know -- there are no unicorns in the space-time world of entities. A unicorn cannot insist on being fed -- or insist on anything else -- if it does not exist. Why not ask the same rudimentary questions of conceptuality and existence about God? Does God exist, and if so, what might he call us to be and to do? The Apostle Paul wrote about the cross of Christ in 1 Corinthians 1, the text from which Caputo takes his point of departure. But elsewhere, Paul stated clearly what the call of God was: "God … now he commands all people everywhere to repent" (Act 17:30).

For God to issue some kind of call that might be heeded, two things must obtain, neither of which Caputo can support. (1) God must exist in such a way as to utter the call -- an impersonal and, thus, incommunicative God could not do this[9] -- and (2) the call must be intelligible to the listener. But Caputo says that God does not exist (in any normal sense of the term) and that the call has no cognitive content. Therefore, the cross cannot mean anything on Caputo's account of being and knowing. No small problem, that.

Only foundational problems in Caputo's account of the cross of Jesus Christ have been identified in this review. If I am right in my critique, nothing else that Caputo says about the cross can be quite right, since all that follows is built on this foundation. As a deconstructionist, Caputo denies any foundation to knowledge, but one must still raise the kinds of issues I have addressed. Everyone -- deconstructionist or otherwise -- owes their reader a coherent account of what he or she is trying to accomplish.

Given the thickly layered and often turgid prose that makes up the book, I would need more words than I have been given to try to untangle every deconstructionist knot and to offer coherent alternatives. The subtitle of this book is "A Theology of Difficult Glory." Caputo accurately identifies a crucial theme in Christian thought and the meaning of the cross: Christ's glory cannot be understood apart from his suffering. In that sense, it is a "difficult glory." But this difficult book denies to the cross what both Paul and Luther saw as its telos: the resurrection of Christ, of his followers, and of the cosmos. And I can find no reason to accept Caputo's revisionist account (where it is intelligible), however novel and daring it might be. I will end this review as Caputo ends his book, since it makes a fitting coda for what is left when everything has been deconstructed.

Exeunt: Doxology

Glory be to the world

Whatever it was in the beginning, whatever it is coming to be,

world without why. Amen

Merci. Adieu, Yes, yes, Alleluia.


[1] John Caputo, What Would Jesus Deconstruct? The Good News of Postmodernism for the Church (Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Academic, 2007). For a contrasting view, see Douglas Groothuis, Truth Decay: Defending Christianity from the Challenges of Postmodernism (Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press, 2000).

[2] John Caputo, Heidegger and Aquinas (New York: Fordham University Press, 1982), 8.

[3] 1964 June 8, Hartford Courant, Wesleyan Baccalaureate Is Delivered by Dr. King by John Craig, Page 4, Hartford, Connecticut. 

[4] 2009 March 19, Time, A New Era of Service Across America by Barack Obama, Time Inc., New York. 

[5] Rodney Stark, The Rise of Christianity: How the Obscure, Marginal Jesus Movement Became the Dominant Religious Force in the Western World in a Few Centuries (San Francisco, HarperCollins, 1996).

[6] Texts such as Psalm 19:1-6 and Romans 1:18-21 are often cited as giving justification that some knowledge of God as Creator is available from nature and apart from Scripture.

[7] Jean Paul Sartre, Existentialism and Human Emotions (New York: Philosophical Library, 1957).

[8] See John Caputo, The Insistence of God: A Theology of Perhaps (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2013).

[9] See Francis A. Schaeffer, He is There and He is Not Silent, 30th anniversary ed. (orig. pub, 1972; Carol Stream, IL: Tyndale Press, 2001).