With this book Jay Lampert has set new standards of clarity and rigour by which future studies of Deleuze will need to be appraised. It is among the very best studies of his work published to date, and one that should ensure Deleuze's work does not remain the sole possession of a lunatic fringe. It is not a complete success. Some of its decisions about Deleuze and about the philosophy of history need to be questioned, and not all of its main theses and arguments equally persuade. Where it does succeed is in laying out with great clarity and precision some of the critical questions that need to be addressed to Deleuze's project, and in showing that there are rich resources in his oeuvre for invigorating questions of history, time, memory, and the future.
Recent years have been dominated by a series of introductions to Deleuze. However, as Lampert rightly notes at the start of his book, we are now past the need of needing further introductions, although this is clearly what publishers want. His book assumes a degree of familiarity with Deleuze's texts and is written for readers who are sympathetic with their conceptual innovations but who are also committed to challenging the arguments in order to determine how far they can be taken. As Lampert further notes, too many commentators on Deleuze only summarise his concepts and largely assume the validity of his projects; rarely is any of this subjected to the comprehensive and demanding scrutiny that the great thinkers in the history of philosophy from Aristotle to Husserl have been subjected to.
Lampert's study is composed of nine chapters. The first is an introduction in which basic and essential questions are raised about the value and validity of approaching Deleuze's work from the perspective of the philosophy of history. This is necessary because, as Lampert readily acknowledges, Deleuze's work often criticises such an approach to history, locating a historicism in modern thought from Hegel to Husserl (and Heidegger) from which he is keen to distance his own project. Moreover, Deleuze clearly signals that he is concerned with 'becomings' and 'events' that are not reducible to history. Indeed, readers who are familiar with Deleuze's work will feel a justified scepticism towards the aims of the book, and its very title will strike them as odd. For Deleuze, Hegel and Heidegger are historicists in the sense that they posit history as a form of interiority in which Spirit or Being develops of necessity and a secret destiny is unveiled. When Deleuze appeals to 'geophilosophy' he is clearly inspired by Ferdinand Braudel's approach to history as geohistory that focuses on the question of why capitalism developed in certain places and at certain moments and not others. Geography is important, Deleuze argues, because it enables one to wrest history from a cult of necessity and of origins; rather, the stress is placed on an irreducible contingency and the power of a milieu. Moreover, history is wrested from itself in order to discover becomings that do not belong to it even if they have it as their condition and necessarily fall back onto it. He insists that an event needs becoming as an unhistorical element. Lampert is, of course, fully cognisant of these points, and it is a major part of the achievement of his book that by the end of it one is largely persuaded by the claim that Deleuze's work can be instructively approached from the perspective of the concerns of the philosophy of history.
Chapters two to four of the book form a set that attempt to illuminate Deleuze's treatment of the three syntheses of time in his major work of 1968, Difference and Repetition. The first of these is the contracted present of habit, the second is the virtual coexistence of past and present (the curious time of memory conceived as a pure past), and the third is the belief in the future that Deleuze locates, ingeniously but questionably, in Nietzsche's theory of the eternal return. Although Lampert does not note this, Deleuze's treatment of time in terms of its principal syntheses was by 1968 a common procedure in French thought -- Sartre and Merleau-Ponty pursue it in their first major texts, for example, in the wake of the projects of the founders of phenomenology in Germany. Deleuze's treatment of the syntheses of time is unique on account of the resources he draws upon to make them work. Principally these are Hume on repetition for the first synthesis, Bergson on memory for the second, and Nietzsche on the future for the third (in Nietzsche and Philosophy of 1962 there is no third synthesis; rather, Nietzsche's synthesis of eternal return is read, in its ontological aspect, through the lens of Bergson). Although the relevance of these syntheses of time to a philosophy of history is not at all self-evident, Lampert's treatment of them is one of the most informative and assured in the literature to date (interested readers should also consult Keith Faulkner's Deleuze and the Three Syntheses of Time, 2006). His interpretation of the notoriously difficult third synthesis in particular is to be applauded and welcomed. Lampert manages to make sense of its most impenetrable but pivotal aspects, such as the notion of the 'dark precursor'. Lampert's great strength is the way in which he focuses exclusively on the arguments that need to be mounted and negotiated in order to have an effective appreciation of, and engagement with, Deleuze's presentation of the syntheses of time. Thus, chapter three considers thirteen arguments, ranging from 'The Argument from Containment' to 'The Argument for Total Coexistence'; whilst, chapter fours considers arguments ranging from 'From Circulation to Action at a Distance' to the three agents of repetition, the three differentiators and the dark precursor.
Chapters five and six form the next set. The previous treatment of Deleuze on the syntheses of time has allowed Lampert to introduce the reader to the main contours of Deleuze's thought, including the all-important notion of the virtual. This is done in a thorough and instructive manner. It is in chapters five and six that he stages an encounter proper between Deleuze and the philosophy of history, dealing with the issues of dating, the problem of historical chronology, the status of Deleuze's notion of the 'quasi-cause', and comparing Deleuze’s views on time, history, and events with Hegel's philosophy of history. There is a wealth of valuable and thought-provoking insights in both chapters that others will wish to pick up on, utilise, and put to the test. For example, Lampert seeks to show that the notion of the quasi-cause, far from being a misnomer and seemingly having little to do with causality, is an attempt to capture the fact that causal force is not a simple mechanism but rather 'pure' variability and temporality. Normal physical causes have to be seen as grounded not in the empirical particulars of a situation but in a virtual system.
Chapters seven to nine form the final set of the book. In these chapters Lampert focuses on the question 'why this now?' as a way of negotiating Deleuze's key claims regarding his conception of 'universal history' as contingency, his concern with capitalism (why did it develop when it did in the West and not develop when it might have in China?), and his innovative notion of 'geophilosophy'. It is at this juncture in the text that Lampert poses a crucially important question: if Deleuze's thinking rests on an ontology of becoming, as evidently seems to be the case, then what role is there within it for the 'why now' question?
It is, then, in parts two and three that the book explicitly deals with Deleuze's contribution to the philosophy of history and where the most important claims regarding this contribution are advanced, developed, and tested. The first part is best read as dealing with Deleuze's remarkable, but highly intricate and at times baffling, philosophy of time. Here Lampert rightly sees Deleuze as making a far-reaching contribution to overturning commonsensical views of the passage of time. The principal argument, developed through the influence of Bergson, is that succession presupposes coexistence. The task is not so much to account for the passing of time -- something that philosophers in the twentieth century have cast doubt on from McTaggart onwards -- but rather to show how the past is more profound than the present and can be accorded genuine ontological status. However, as I have already indicated, precisely how this relates to the concerns of the philosophy of history is not at all clear. Bergson's Matter and Memory, a text that Deleuze regarded as amongst the most important in modern thought, is primarily a contribution to the philosophy of mind, one that engages with developments in modern philosophy from Descartes, Hume, and Berkeley to Kant and the rise of modern psychology, including nineteenth-century associationism. Questions of history and of historical memory and duration are to a large extent significantly absent from Bergson's oeuvre. Now, if the thought is that the resources of the ontological past -- by which is meant a past beyond the order of mere psychological recollection -- are open to the historian, then this highly provocative suggestion needs to be adequately demonstrated and argued for. I do not see this taking place seriously at any point in Lampert's study. It would be a startling claim to make, one that for a start would bypass most of the key questions about history that concern philosophers of it. It would have been better if the author had provided more of a bridge between parts one and two of the book. As it is, the book tends to leap from the philosophy of time developed in the first part to the explicit concern with questions of history raised in part two.
Parts two and three of the book, then, are the most important for those seeking an appreciation of Deleuze's contribution to the philosophy of history. What are the main concepts and what are the challenges made by them to prevailing approaches and configurations? Perhaps the most original and novel claim is that what is to be dated in history are not factual changes or simple states of affairs but rather 'virtual events'. The point is that whilst factual changes take place at determinate points in chronological time (1789, 1917, May '68), they do not properly acquire dates until they have been extracted from simple succession and get reoriented on a virtual plane -- a plane of 'becoming' -- where all events are said to coexist. Deleuze's innovation as a thinker of time is to argue that the proper transcendental form of time must account for both Chronos and non-Chronos. The dare of Lampert's study is to test the extent to which this claim about time -- that there is more to it than mere succession and linear unfolding -- can be applied to questions of history. The result is a set of genuinely strange but compelling claims about our relation to history and the nature of historical time, for example, the claim that history is subject to retroactive forces (something we find prefigured in Nietzsche, see The Gay Science 34).
Deleuze accords a special status and meaning to events. He develops his logic of events at different times in his intellectual life and with reference to different sources, sometimes through the notion of the phantasm in psychoanalysis (in The Logic of Sense Deleuze argues that Freud's Totem and Taboo is the great theory of the event), sometimes through Leibniz and Whitehead, and sometimes in terms of an engagement with Husserl's phenomenology. In The Logic of Sense, for example, the phantasm-event is said to be distinguished from the corresponding state of affairs, whether it is real or possible. The phantasm presents the event as a noematic attribute that renders it distinct from the actions, passions, and qualities of an actual state of affairs (a noematic attribute is a pure predicate that is different from the physical quality of a thing, for example 'to die' as opposed to the mere physical fact of one's empirical death). This is phenomenology's way of opening up an intentional consciousness by right, the positing and giving of sense. The phantasm-event exists in language and can be expressed in language, but here it has the significance of the verb or the infinitive that bears witness to the presence of a 'pure' event. From the mere occurrence of a body, an object, or a place, one can extract an event in the form of a singularity, such as a birth, a death, a love, and so on. Why phantasm? Because in each one of these happenings there is a host of expectations, anticipations, hopes, fears, and so on.
In support of his theory, Deleuze draws heavily on the Stoic distinction between incorporeal events and bodily states of affairs that for him entails an upheaval in philosophy. This is because it challenges the assumptions of Aristotle's metaphysics that all categories are said of Being and that difference is present in Being between substance (primary sense) and the other categories that are related to it as accidents. On one level, reality is nothing but bodies that interpenetrate, poison each other, insinuate themselves into one another, reinforce or destroy one another. On another level, however, it is also composed of incorporeal effects. From bodily struggles there arises a sort of 'incorporeal vapour' that no longer consists in qualities, in actions or in passions, or in causes acting upon one another, but rather in effects which result from all these causes taken together. These impassive and incorporeal events lie on the surface of things; they are pure infinitives that participate in what Deleuze calls 'extra-Being' (to green, to cut, to die, to love). The attribute no longer names a quality related to a subject by the indicative or copula 'is', but is any verb whatever in the infinitive that emerges from a state of things and skims over it. These infinitive-becomings have no subject but refer only to the 'it' of the event or haecceity (it is raining, or it is five o' clock in the evening). Take the example of the battle, a favoured example of Deleuze's (Stephen Crane's Red Badge of Courage of 1895 is, he says, the great novel of the event). It takes place, but the question is, 'where is the event of the battle?' Deleuze's point is that the battle is in many places all at once because each participant may grasp it at a different level of actualisation within its variable present. Qua event the battle hovers over its own field and is neutral in relation to all of its temporal actualisations. What happens is incarnated in some actual state of affairs and involves a set of historical factors. This is obvious. But what is not so obvious are the events of these things. Deleuze is claiming that an actualisation or an accomplishment is not enough; rather there is always a 'becoming' that awaits and precedes us. The task, then, is to counter-effectuate the event, to accompany the effect that is without body, namely, the part which goes beyond the accomplishment. For Deleuze this is what it means to practice an ethics of amor fati, which he sees as being one with the struggle of free human beings, and in which the task is to be equal to the 'events' that befall us and provide us with our becomings.
There is one event that stands out for Deleuze and that he always remained faithful to as a French intellectual. This is May '68, which he offers as an example of a pure event. This can be grasped not on the level of empirical description because in an event there is an aspect that is not reducible to social determinism or causal chains. This is the aspect that escapes those historians who always seek to restore causality after the fact. As Deleuze conceives it, an event is a splitting off from and breaking with causality, a bifurcation and a deviation with respect to laws, an unstable condition that opens up a new field of the possible. Deleuze freely acknowledges that May '68 was characterised by agitations, slogans, idiocies, and illusions, but for him these are not what count. What counts is what amounts to a visionary phenomenon, as if society suddenly sees what is intolerable in it and the possibility of something else comes into perspective. In this happening, the possible does not pre-exist but is created by the event. The event, then, creates a new existence, evident for example in the form of new modes of subjectivity, including new relations with the body and new conceptions of time, of sexuality, of work and culture, and so on. Lampert's study seeks to show that this novel theory of events has all kinds of critical application for the philosophy of history. Every step of the way he refuses to rest content with the claims and innovations of Deleuze's system until he has staged a set of critical questions about them that can put them to the test.
If I have one major criticism of his study, however, it is that it is often intellectually too narrow and neglects important moments in modern thought where a serious contribution to philosophical thinking about history has been made. Whilst he has a first-rate grasp of the likes of Hegel, Husserl, and Heidegger, and whilst he yields genuinely instructive insights into Deleuze and Derrida on questions of history, as well as showing what is important in Foucault's oeuvre for Deleuze, he could have situated this inquiry in a much wider context. It is never made clear just where the conception of the philosophy of history the book supposes comes from. For example, on the very first page of the book's opening chapter the core topics that are said to constitute the philosophy of history are listed. They include making a distinction between historical and non-historical occurrences such as natural and everyday, social ones; a determination of how much empirical evidence is required to justify claims about history; a principle for the ordering of events; a theory of historical causality; and an attempt to sketch the main stages of actual human history. However, where this list of core topics comes from, and why these are the ones that need to be foregrounded, is never made clear. The list is quite arbitrary and fails to recognise that what is taken unquestioningly to constitute the core topics has been contested by philosophers who have concerned themselves with questions of history. For example, in his On History and Other Essays, the British political philosopher Michael Oakeshott argued that in historical discourse the word 'cause' is a loose, insignificant expression and that causal relationships do not lie at the centre of historical inquiry (he is one with Deleuze in denying that an historical occurrence has a necessary or essential character). In addition, there is no engagement in this study with the various attempts within modern thought to provide a definition of history. Thinkers as diverse as Hannah Arendt, Walter Benjamin, Karl Löwith, Jan Patočka, and Paul Ricoeur, have made a series of seminal contributions. Owing to the neglect of this profound body of work, it is ultimately unclear why Lampert thinks Deleuze's approach to history should compel us. The ambit of the book is, ultimately, too insular.
The author notes, correctly in my view, that Deleuze's critical remarks about the likes of Husserl and Heidegger fail to do justice to either. However, this important issue is not pursued. How might the projects of these thinkers be made to respond to Deleuze's questions and the blindspots or prejudices of 'geophilosophy'? In his Crisis of the European Sciences, worked out in the mid 1930s and published posthumously, Husserl called for a decision over philosophy that was to be guided by the following question: is the telos that was inborn in European humanity at the birth of philosophy in ancient Greece merely the accidental acquisition of merely one among many other civilizations and histories, or is Greek humanity to be regarded as the first breakthrough to what is essential to humanity as such, its entelechy? If the promise or potential of this humanity can be upheld, a promise that is mature in reason in the sense that it has made the move from latent to manifest reason and seeks its own norms through its truths, then the philosopher has earned the right to claim that within itself European humanity bears an absolute idea, and that it is not simply an empirical-anthropological type such as 'China' or 'India'. It is this view and this conception of philosophy that Deleuze sets out to undermine with 'geophilosophy', and in the name of contingency and the becomings of oppressed peoples. Europeanisation, he argues, does not constitute a becoming but merely the history of capitalism, which prevents the becoming of subjected peoples. Deleuze's criticism of Husserl's attachment to reason, advanced at a time when unreason had become the norm in Germany, not only displays a lack of intellectual generosity, it perhaps also falls prey to some of the worst aspects of post-modern correctness.
There is, however, a deeper philosophical problem surrounding Deleuze's novel theory of events. Let me put the matter a little too starkly. Is the geophilosopher able to raise and pose the question of the value of an event? This is a Nietzschean-inspired question that Deleuze does not address. Whether conceived as an event of history or of a virtual becoming, how do we determine the value of a historical event such as the Renaissance, the Reformation, or the French Revolution? Is it simply the fact that the 'possible' shows itself? But are not all kinds of things 'possible'? Deleuze makes extensive use in his writings of Nietzsche's appeal to the untimely (which is also the unfashionable), but what this denotes is contestable. What Deleuze finds untimely, Nietzsche would find timely, all-too timely. As Paul Patton has noted (in the introduction to his Deleuze: A Critical Reader), Deleuze's conception of philosophy can offer neither criteria for judging the importance of events nor rules for the attribution of events to states of affairs. The events that a Deleuzian-inspired philosophy seeks to discover and promote are those that deterritorialise the present and point towards a different future. Thinking is a dice-throw, a form of experimentation, where the aim is to determine concepts of the events that determine our fate. The criteria by which such concepts can be assessed for a Deleuzian are those of the new, remarkable, and the interesting. By contrast, when Nietzsche raises the question of value he always stresses the 'for what?' aspect (that is, what are one's ends and goals? What kind of humanity does one wish culture to produce?). My concern is simply this: how can we be sure that Deleuze's thinking does not reinstate a continental common sense or good sense? (as in 'everybody knows that the French Revolution was a good thing'). It is too easy to say that a 'becoming' is what is at stake in any historical event simply because the notion is so indeterminate. Deleuze has made a commitment to certain values, but it is not clear that he can tell us where they come from and what norms of thinking they presuppose or rest on.
Lampert's study succeeds in winning over one's initial scepticism. Because it appreciates the need for clear arguments and adequate demonstration, it succeeds admirably in making the case for interpreting Deleuze as a philosopher of history. This is a brilliant and major study that can be strongly recommended to anyone interested in Deleuze's project and in questions concerning history. In fact, I cannot recommend it strongly enough.will