2018.06.06

Klaas J. Kraay (ed.)

Does God Matter? Essays on the Axiological Consequences of Theism

Klaas J. Kraay (ed.), Does God Matter? Essays on the Axiological Consequences of Theism, Routledge, 2018, 228 pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415793513.

Reviewed by David Johnson, Yeshiva University


These authors are generally careful about definitions, and about side-stepping somehow the issue of the vacuous truth of counterfactuals having impossible antecedents. I have very little space, so I won't be careful about either of these things. Let's just say that pro-theism says that it's a good thing to have God around, anti-theism says it's a bad thing, and the book is mostly about which view is correct. Setting aside the completely trivial arguments, all of the more substantive and important arguments (all the arguments, I think, which might have any tendency to alarm anyone) are imperfect beings.

Erik J. Wielenberg ("The Absurdity of Life in a Christian Universe as a Reason to Prefer that God Not Exist"), mimicking William Lane Craig's notion of what might make life absurd, gives (p. 148) "the following definition of absurdity":

Claim C makes life absurd = df. Claim C's truth makes (or would make) true at least one claim C1 such that most (actual) human beings are such that if they were to accept C1 they would experience negative psychological consequences that would make it difficult or impossible for them to be happy (without also failing to accept at least one entailment of C).

After reminding us that according to Christ the second greatest commandment is "to love your neighbor as yourself," Wielenberg gives (149-50) "the Absurdity Argument":

1. Necessarily, if God exists, then whenever a person P experiences undeserved involuntary suffering, P is better off overall than P would have been without the suffering.

2. So: Necessarily, if God exists, then whenever a person A causes another person B to experience undeserved involuntary suffering, B is better off overall than B would have been without the suffering (from 1).

3. God's existence makes it true (or would make it true) that each of us is morally obligated to pursue the good of others.

4. Necessarily, if (i) A is morally obligated to pursue B's good and (ii) A's performing act X would make B better off overall, then (iii) A has a fact-relative reason to perform X.

5. So, God's existence makes it true (or would make it true) that C: each of us has a fact-relative reason to cause others to experience undeserved involuntary suffering (from 2, 3, and 4).

6. Most human beings are such that if they were to accept (C), they would experience negative psychological consequences that would make it difficult or impossible for them to be happy (without also failing to accept at least one entailment of (C)).

7. Therefore, the claim that God exists makes life absurd (from 5 and 6).

Wielenberg says (150) that 1 is based on the principle "that a morally perfect God would not permit the existence of any gratuitous evil, evil that is not necessary in order to prevent an equal or worse evil or necessary to produce some great good," and "the further claim that if God permits a certain evil to befall a particular individual, God's moral perfection requires not merely that the evil be compensated for somewhere in the universe but . . . in the life of the very person who endures that evil."

Need I say anything more? Because of the phrase 'an equal or' in the first principle, we do not have 1 above, only its analogue 1*, where 'better' is replaced by 'no worse'; and analogously, we won't have 2, but only 2*. But then, to get to 5, on pain of non-sequitur, 2* and 3 with 4 do not suffice; we should need to have 4*. But 4* is obviously false. So, this argument collapses. (Wielenberg could go back and strike out the words 'an equal or' in his principle, but this would solve nothing; for there is a reason why he wrote the words in the first place.)

On pp. 52-3, Michael Tooley gives a purported proof of "Mini-Theorem 1: Anti-Theism Entails Atheism." I have no space to discuss its sixteen steps, but, to give you some of the flavor of it, I display its opening non-sequitur:

1. God is by definition an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfectly good being who exists at every time.

2. It is logically impossible for there to be logically necessary connections between temporally distinct states of affairs.

Therefore, from 1 and 2:

3. If an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfectly good being existed at any time earlier than now, that being had the power to bring it about that no omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfectly good being exists now, and that being knew that it had that power.

Another reason why I won't go through the entire supposed proof is that Tooley himself says (p. 54):

There is a familiar idea that, if sound, would be a devastating objection to the preceding argument. It is that the idea of a being greater than which no being can even be conceived [Tooley's definition of 'God'; i.e., the God of Anselm] entails that such a being would be a logically necessary being, and a being all of whose basic powers would also be logically necessary [i.e., nota bene: logically essential properties of it].

On p. 54, Tooley then gives an argument to show that the existence of the God of Anselm is not thus "logically necessary." Here is the crucial portion:

4. No contradiction can be derived from the proposition that the only things that exist that can enter into causal relationships are a number of neutrinos in an infinite Euclidean spacetime.

5. If no contradiction can be derived from a proposition, then it is logically possible for the proposition to be true.

Hence, from 4 and 5:

6. It is logically possible that there does not exist anything that can enter into causal relationships beyond a number of neutrinos in an infinite Euclidean spacetime.

7. A world that contains nothing that can enter into causal relationships beyond a number of neutrinos in an infinite Euclidean spacetime does not contain any omnipotent being.

Therefore, from 6 and 7:

8. It is logically possible that there is no omnipotent being.

Tooley never tells us what "logical necessity" is. He speaks of the "derivability" of a contradiction, but leaves us to guess whether he is speaking of formal derivation in some (understood) formal logic, or merely the entailment of a contradiction, or the a priori discernibility of the entailment of a contradiction, or something else. Having no space for an extended discussion of exegetical hypotheses, I must be brief. Read £p as "It is logically necessary that p". I assume that "It is logically possible that p" means ~ £ ~ p. Let:

Lp mean "It is provable that p" (in an understood formal logic)

□p mean "It is necessary that p" (i.e., metaphysically necessary)

A□p mean "It is humanly knowable a priori that □p"

K□p mean "It is humanly knowable that □p"

Consider the following two groups:

(I) £p means (choose from below)

(a) Lp

(b) □p

(c) Lp & □p

(d) A□p

(e) K□p

(II) That a contradiction can be derived from the proposition that p means that there is some proposition q such that (choose from below)

(f) L (p → (q & ~ q))

(g) □(p → (q & ~ q))

(h) L (p → (q & ~ q)) & □(p → (q & ~ q))

(i) A□(p → (q & ~ q))

(j) K□(p → (q & ~ q))

Then any philosopher can easily discover that there is no <α, β>, where α is selected from (I) and β from (II), such that Tooley's argument for 8, thus construed, is cogent against someone who holds that the existence of the God of Anselm is "logically necessary" in the sense of α. I have space for only one illustration. If α is (d) then for 7 we would have (at most) necessity, not logical necessity. For it is not a priori knowably necessary that no neutrino is an omnipotent being (any more than that no neutrino can shift to integral spin, or outrun light). But then the inference of 8 from 6 and 7 is a non-sequitur. For from ~ A□ ~ p and □(p → q), it does not follow that ~ A □ ~ q. (Let p be the proposition that water exists but is not H2O. Let q be your favorite contradiction.)

Recall that the potential "devastating objection" about which Tooley is concerned has two claims: (i) the existence of the God of Anselm is logically necessary, and (ii) His "basic powers" are logically essential to Him (e.g., it is logically necessary that if He exists then He is omnipotent). If Tooley cannot preclude (i), can he perhaps preclude (ii)? On p. 55, Tooley gives an argument to show that omnipotence is not a logically essential property of any entity. The language in which the argument is stated is very casual, introducing multiple ambiguities. But, understanding that the goal is to refute (ii), independently of any refutation of (i), the argument must be the following: omnipotence is an intrinsic property (I don't think this is obvious, but suppose it is so); no intrinsic property is an essential property of any entity; thus, omnipotence is not an essential property of any entity, and a fortiori not a logically essential property of any entity. But, of course, the claim that no intrinsic property is an essential property of any entity is absurd. (Existence; self-identity; the abstractness of π; being made of wood, as both intrinsic and essential to a block of wood; et cetera.)

Tooley also has "Mini-Theorem 2: If God Exists, It Is Extremely Likely that God Is Not Omniscient." The idea is that "all persons have a right to the privacy of their thoughts and feelings," even in relationship to their omniscient and perfect creator. This seems to me quite silly, but suppose it is bad even for God to access your thoughts or feelings without permission, "unless doing so has one or more right-making properties that outweigh the wrong-making property" and that "it is unlikely in the extreme that there is never a single thought or feeling where there is no right-making property," so that Tooley gets to (p. 66):

15. If there is an omnipotent and omniscient being, it is extremely likely that that being has done something morally wrong.

Tooley then says

Therefore, from 15:

16. If there is a being that is both omnipotent and morally perfectly good, it is extremely likely that that being is not omniscient.

15 and 16 can charitably only be construed as speaking of conditional probabilities; but, in fact, of universally quantified conditional probabilities, forcing us to make allowance for objects for which these are not defined. We will return to these baroque constructions presently. But for now, setting Tooley aside, just imagine some philosopher who argues in the following way: "There is a non-zero probability that God is omnipotent and morally perfectly good. Having done something morally wrong is incompatible with being morally perfectly good. And it is extremely likely that God has done something morally wrong, given that God is omnipotent and omniscient. Therefore, it is extremely likely that God is not omniscient, given that God is omnipotent and morally perfectly good." This would be a stunning non-sequitur. It is not a theorem of the probability calculus that, where Pr(A & D) ≠ 0 and C and D are incompatible, if Pr(C/A & B) is high then Pr(~ B/A & D) is high. Let there be a bipyramid, which I will simply call a great die, with faces numbered 1, . . . , n, where n is a very large even number. Assume a non-zero chance of you rolling a 2. Assume it is extremely likely that you do not get a 2, given that you roll the die and the die is fair. Does it follow that it is extremely likely that the die is not fair, given that you roll the die and get a 2? (Or: simply let Pr(B) = 1.)

Returning to Tooley's 15 and 16: where P = "is omnipotent," S = "is omniscient," W = "has done something morally wrong," and G = "is morally perfectly good," consider:

(I)    (x) □ (Gx → ~ Wx)

(II)   (x)(Pr(Px & Sx) ≠ 0 → Pr(Wx/Px & Sx) is high)

(III)  (x)(Pr(Px & Gx) ≠ 0 → Pr(~ Sx/Px & Gx) is high)

Tooley is obviously thinking that it's a theorem of the probability calculus that if (I) and (II) hold then (III) holds. But obviously it isn't. (Let P = "rolls the die," S = "is self-identical and the die is fair," W = "does not get a 2 and does not get a 3," G = "gets a 2," m = you. Assume that the great die is fair, and that Pr(Pm) ≠ 0. Let Pr(Sm) ≥ 1 - [Pr(Pm) / n-squared]. (I) and (II) hold; Pr(Pm & Gm) ≠ 0; Pr(~ Sm/Pm & Gm) ≤ 1/n.)

Scott A. Davison (p. 43) displays the following argument:

P1. Something has intrinsic value to a certain degree if a fully informed, properly functioning valuer would value it for its own sake to that degree.

P2. If God were to exist, God would be a fully informed, properly functioning valuer.

P3. If God were to exist, God would possess intrinsically a significant combination of great-making features (perhaps even the best possible combination) to the highest possible degree.

P4. If God were to exist, God would value God for God's own sake to a significant degree.

C. If God were to exist, God would possess intrinsic value to a significant degree (perhaps even the highest possible degree).

Shortly thereafter he says "the argument is clearly valid." The argument is not clearly valid. (A word to the wise: the argument-form P □→ Q, P □→ R ├ P □→ (Q □→ R) is valid only in a strongly-centered logic of counterfactuals. A number of philosophers, including Alvin Plantinga and Jordan Howard Sobel, have argued that our logic of counterfactuals should in general be only weakly-centered. It is not obvious that they are mistaken.)

In some essays, an argument "set out . . . explicitly" devolves simply into comedic uses of the word 'therefore', as in Guy Kahane's move from (D) to (E) on p. 103:

(D) There are possible atheist worlds that offer all (or most) of the benefits of God's existence but without the costs.

Therefore,

(E) Some atheist worlds are overall the best, or among the best, and are superior to all theist alternatives.

The bank's new Decapitation accounts are tax-free, and offer (most of) the benefits of their heavily-taxed Non-Decapitation accounts. (I take it that in Kahanese 'therefore' means: "I 'can just shrug' [105] if you don't go along with this move.")

J. L. Schellenberg's 'It follows' (p. 183, six lines from bottom) is an obvious formal non-sequitur. (Intuitive hint: that "being rightly related" to God "makes for the ultimate good of creatures and the world," says nothing about what not being rightly related to God makes for.)

The argument displayed by Myron A. Penner and Benjamin H. Arbour on p. 195 is invalid, as a little reflection about their 'All else being equal' operator makes plain. (Think of poisoned-pawn strategies, and moves in chess.)

A brief dialogue between Stephen Maitzen and René Descartes:

Maitzen: "The universe obeys the laws of logic" (133).

Descartes: But suppose: ~ (the universe obeys the laws of logic).

Maitzen: That's "no more intelligible than gibberish" (144).

Descartes: I recant. It is not the case that: ~ (the universe obeys the laws of logic).

Maitzen: It is not the case that what? That's no more intelligible than saying 'It is not the case that @#$%^&*.' [Cf. n.4, p. 144.]

Descartes: Then you're saying that intelligibility can be lost through double negation?

Maitzen has scarcely refuted Augustine's view that it is only with divine help that we know that the universe obeys the laws of logic: God knows it by direct inspection of the universe, and then gives us an irresistible impulse to believe. (It may be that we also cannot even think about anything, without divine help. God himself can think about particular things, and He can pretend that we are thinking about particular things. But then our mental state is indeed connected with a unique object. Then, perhaps, that is just what it is for us to be thinking about that object, at least if the divine pretense is kindly and wise. If a lion could speak, God in His mercy would understand him.)

The last essay in the book, by Richard B. Davis and W. Paul Franks about whether Plantinga's free will defense is compatible with his later theodicy, is a nice example of a carefully argued paper in which everything seems to work except the main point. Where J is the property of being identical to Jesus, H the property of being human, and C the property of being a created being, the argument of the essay depends upon our being convinced that J entails C, from the fact that it is so very obvious that J entails H, and H entails C. This seems absurd. Either the pre-incarnate Jesus was always human, or he wasn't. If he wasn't, then obviously there was a time at which someone had J without having H, in which case the former does not entail the latter. If the pre-incarnate Jesus was always human then, since (as is the case according to orthodox Christianity) the pre-incarnate Jesus is not a created being, H does not entail C. Therefore, either J does not entail H, or H does not entail C. And then there is no objection to the normal Christian view, which might have been given as the immediate response to the authors: simply because the pre-incarnate Jesus is not a created being, J obviously does not entail C.