If you're reading this review because you urgently want to know what the meaning of life is, let me get that out of the way so that you can decide how to spend your freed up time. According to Cheshire Calhoun, living a meaningful life is a matter of "expending your life's time on ends that, in your best judgment, you take yourself to have reason to value for their own sake and thus to expend your life's time on" (46). If you're going to stop reading now, let me also, quickly and strongly, recommend expending some of your time reading Calhoun's book, because it is full of interesting puzzles, illuminating examples, and deep insights about human experience. This book represents the best of what philosophers have to offer: clear, rigorous, systematic thinking about things that matter to how we live our lives.
The book defends a "subjective" account of the meaningful life, in contrast to accounts that take meaning to be defined in terms of values that are independent of the agents who value them, and to "hybrid" accounts that take meaning to consist in a combination of a subjective response to objective value. It includes fascinating and often surprising discussions about hope, commitment, and boredom. The different chapters, many of which are adapted from previously published papers, do not always hang together tightly, but taken together, they cohere in an overall perspective that is new and refreshingly humane. To live meaningfully, according to Calhoun, you do not have to save the world, you do not have to make yourself miserable in the pursuit of lofty goals, you do not need to have lifelong commitments to worthy projects, and you do not have to ensure that you are never bored. It's not that living a meaningful life is easy, on Calhoun's view, but she does make it a reasonable aspiration for us all.
Calhoun's subjectivism about meaningful living puts our evaluative agency at the center. To live meaningful lives, according to Calhoun, we must judge what we have reason to value for its own sake and choose to spend our time on these things. One of the most helpful ideas in the book, to my mind, has to do with the different ways we can choose to spend time. Calhoun distinguishes four categories of time expenditures: "primary, filler, entailed, and norm required" (14). In primary spending, we spend time on the ends we take to be worth pursuing for their own sakes. So, for a philosophy professor, preparing a lecture, working on a book, or reading an article, would likely count as primary spending. Entailed spending is the time we spend doing things that are merely instrumental to our valued ends, such as commuting or hooking up a computer to a printer. Norm required spending is what we do to follow various norms (moral, legal, and so on), and filler spending "is what we do while waiting, or when we're too tired or ill or unmotivated to do much of anything else" (15) -- think online shopping, Sudoku, or whatever else you waste your time on. The point of these distinctions is that meaningfulness is "a function of one's primary expenditures" and, further, that it's not just what you spend your time on that matters but how much of your time you spend on it. The person who does more primary spending on less valuable ends may have a more meaningful life than the person who spends most of her time on things that are merely entailed by more valuable ends.
It may be that the reason I found this discussion so worthwhile is that my current administrative role as a department chair entails a lot of time expended on sitting in meetings and doing various other things that do not seem intrinsically valuable to me. Inspired by the saying "research is me-search", I was led to think about Calhoun's role as the Chair of the Board of Officers of the American Philosophical Association (APA) since 2014. We philosophers have been extremely fortunate to have had her service; the APA has absolutely flourished during her tenure. There must be a good deal of entailed spending in this role, and the philosophical community should be grateful that she judged this spending to be worth it. I don't think these distinctions between types of time expenditures are only helpful for administrators, however. Everyone spends time doing things that are not in themselves valuable, or wastes time in ways that have no connection to value at all. Calhoun's primary example here is of Betty Friedan's housewife who spent a lot of her time doing things she took to be entailed by being a wife and mother, like washing the dishes (16). Articulating the different ways that we can fail to spend time in meaning-contributing ways is likely to be helpful to anyone who is trying to figure out how best to live with limited time.
The agency that is crucial to Calhoun's account involves judgment about how to spend our time; it also involves motivation: we must continue to be motivated by these reasons we judge ourselves to have. This observation leads to some of Calhoun's most insightful discussions of barriers to agency such as depression and lack of hope. The example of "normative estrangement", in particular, caused me to question my own views about values and valuing. To be normatively estranged is to be disconnected or unmoved by your own values. Normative estrangement is
on one hand, to continue to think that if one is going to have a normative outlook at all, one's present outlook is the one that one wants to have . . . On the other hand, one comes to feel that one is not capable of being the person who values these things, who deliberates on their basis, and who is moved to act in keeping with them. (58)
Calhoun uses the example of the depressed character Laura Brown from Michael Cunningham's The Hours to illustrate the point. Laura Brown is estranged from the values of motherhood and wifeliness, which are, on Calhoun's interpretation, her own values.
In my work on valuing I side with Calhoun's opponents in holding that such cases are cases in which one does not fully value the ends that make up one's normative outlook; they are cases of incomplete, or less than fully robust, valuing, and, therefore, the person is not entirely estranged from her own values. But Calhoun argues that this way of thinking about it misdescribes these cases because, as she says about Laura Brown,
At the time of her depression, there is virtually no indication that there is something else she wants more than the life she has. The absence of some alternative, truer normative outlook with which she identifies (if only she would admit it) is part of what makes this particular way of losing interest in one's future so devastating. One is estranged from the only present and future self one wishes to have. (62)
Ultimately, I'm not sure I'm persuaded by Calhoun's analysis, but I am persuaded that her view is a worthy alternative and that it matters which way you think about it. If we think about what it would take to help someone like Laura Brown, it does seem a worse predicament to lose touch with the only values one has than to be conflicted or unware of one's true values.
It would be devastating to lose interest in the only values one has. It also doesn't seem so great to be hopeless, bored, lacking in commitment, or resigned to a "good enough life". But Calhoun does not think all of these things are very bad, let alone devastating. Hopelessness is a serious barrier to agency, but she argues that the other things on this list are either a normal part of life or, as in the case of commitment, a choice that an agent might make but isn't required to make in order to have a meaningful life. The chapter on commitment is another example of a rich and thought-provoking discussion of what it is like to be a person. The conclusion of the chapter is that whether one lives a life of substantive, time-extended commitments (on the one hand) or provisional plans (on the other) is a matter of normative style. For many philosophers, commitment is probably our style. But, as Calhoun argues, a person with a different style may benefit by making fewer sacrifices of "local meaning". Such a life "need not be devoid of contributions to the social good, enriching personal interactions, the development of skills, and the acquisition of knowledge, even if one is not committed to making one's life about such things" (112).
I will close with a question about the central concept of meaningful living, with which the book begins. There is a fair amount of overlap between the view of meaningfulness developed in this book and certain theories found in the well-being literature. I would say that subjectivism about well-being is more widely accepted than subjectivism about meaningfulness, perhaps because of various arguments that have been made about the subject-relativity of the concept of "well-being" (for one influential example see Sumner 1995). I myself defend a "value fulfillment" theory of well-being that has much in common with Calhoun's subjective theories of meaningful living (Tiberius 2018, see also Raibley 2010). It has always seemed to me that an attractive view about the difference between well-being and meaningfulness is that the former is subjective while the latter requires a combination of objective value and subjective response to it. This view about meaningfulness is called a "hybrid" theory and is defended by Susan Wolf (2010), among others. Calhoun rejects hybrid theories because there is "a risk that such a view would be ad hoc and that the subjective and agent-independent components might recommend different things" (31).
I'm not entirely persuaded by the objections to the hybrid theory. First, while it is true that "subjective attraction" and "objective worthwhileness" could pull in different directions, this seems to be a problem of application. The application of such a two-part theory will be messy and the lines between meaningful living and its opposite may not end up being black and white. But in other places, Calhoun seems quite tolerant of the messiness of life, so I'm not sure why she should see this as such a problem. Second, whether or not the move to hybridism is ad hoc or well motivated depends on what the other options are, and if subjectivism has other serious problems, there might be good reasons to favor a view that pairs subjective attraction with objective worthwhileness. Calhoun argues, persuasively, that one reason to abandon objectivism about meaningfulness is that it collapses meaningfulness into valuableness (23). But if the subjective theory of meaningfulness collapses meaning into well-being, it has a similar problem. While it may have other problems, the hybrid theory at least carves out conceptual space for a meaningful life that is distinct from both an objectively good life and a life that achieves well-being. (Of course, a different conclusion will be drawn by those who favor a hybrid theory of well-being.)
Perhaps Calhoun's theory would be better conceived as a theory of well-being or flourishing. As someone who works on well-being (rather than meaningfulness), I would certainly value her contributions to our field and I hereby invite her to join our club! Ultimately, however, I don't think it's that important whether the theory that Calhoun defends would be more accurately described with a different term. Her book is full of ideas and observations that are interesting, important, and fun to think about. It's worth your time.
Raibley, J.R. (2010), "Well-Being and the Priority of Values", Social Theory and Practice, 36 (4): 593 -- 620.
Sumner, L. W. (1995), "The Subjectivity of Welfare", Ethics, 105 (4): 764 -- 790.
Tiberius, V. (2018), Well-Being as Value Fulfillment: how we can help each other to live well, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
Wolf, S. (2010), Meaning in Life and Why It Matters, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.