"Who would I show it to" -- W. S. Merwin, "Elegy"
This book recasts Søren Kierkegaard's religious discourses as compellingly, even startlingly, philosophical. Rather than a moral or a theological reading, David Kangas explains, he elaborates a "philosophical" reading, one that may well surprise us with the honed critique of idealism, as well as the overturning of ontotheology, that Kangas draws out of the discourses. Combining deft exegesis with incisive attention to the history of philosophy, it models an encounter with Kierkegaard's discourses that holds great significance for how to make sense of the critical, phenomenological and ultimately existential work performed by these nineteenth-century texts. How to read Kierkegaard is one of the stakes of this book, stakes that Kangas models and theorizes throughout each chapter.
In the introduction, Kangas identifies the mode of reading that, on his account, the religious discourses solicit: reading them, not once or twice but three times. This, Kangas explains, is the conditioning possibility through which reading changes everything: "the sudden glimpse of an experience of being that cannot be well formulated in normalized concepts or common sense 'sayings.' Everything must be undone and redone. But this requires patience" (2-3). And, indeed, patience is one of the key words of this book, such that the qualities like patience that enable this mode of reading are also at the heart of the discourses' own errant and edifying meaning. Read like this, the religious discourses cease to pass as pious sermons, Kangas explains, and instead engage the reader "like a palimpsest" (2) of the attunement or "originariness" (166) that we ourselves might acquire as readers.
A palimpsest is how Roland Barthes describes the status of the text for modern readers: never originary, in itself, but an expression of what has already expressed itself, namely language. "The birth of the reader must be requited by the death of the Author," Barthes explains (1989, 55), as reading draws us into an encounter with temporality because "every text is eternally written here and now" (1989, 52) While twentieth-century thinkers like Barthes are often credited with inaugurating such insights, Kangas demonstrates how Kierkegaard's nineteenth-century texts draw together reflections on temporality with an emergent "birth" of the reader, long before Barthes's own authorship. The religious discourses, for example, do not lay claim to the authority of the Author (2), Kangas notes, but more importantly, they stage the very "ontological problematic" (115) that Barthes' death of the author presupposes. "To conquer or totalize time is precisely what the self cannot do" (22); this in-capability occasions "the how of an undergoing" (150) for each self or reader, what Kangas identifies as the most pressing problem of Kierkegaard's religious writings.
And as the reader undergoes an unlearning (56), the discourse itself yields its philosophical meaning. Consider, for example, this evocative statement by Kangas: "The book, ontologically, is a bird" (133). The specific book, in this statement, is one of Kierkegaard's discourses on the bird of the air, as portrayed in The Gospel of Matthew. In addition to its biblical content, this discourse performs the very work that, on Kangas's reading, Kierkegaard draws out of the figure of the bird: the text "transcendentalizes," to use one of Kangas's own important concepts (52). Transcendentalizing or ontologizing, Kangas explains, is no idealist self-positing or -grounding; rather it entails a withdrawal from teleology all together (45), an un-doing, which is also an allowing. The reader of this discourse encounters the very conditions for becoming attuned to the given -- with no end goal, and no why (48).
This whylessness verges uncomfortably close, for this reviewer, to a dilemma that inheres in the act of reviewing a book that was published posthumously. It's not only that there can be no hope of a response by the book's author, no expressions of either assent or divergence. While both would be welcome, it's divergence from my account of his book that I most wish to hope for. We shared many commitments, philosophically, but in an especially animated conversation about methods of interpretation, several years ago, I failed to persuade David that Gilles Deleuze is who we should bring into conversation with Kierkegaard; no, David maintained, Spinoza is a better choice of interlocutor, a suggestion that several passages here play out productively. This is a conversation that I want badly to continue. More difficult is that readers, like me, will miss the next movement, in the trajectory from Kierkegaard's Instant (2007) to this book to whatever creative and critical work would have followed. Natality and mortality are insistent themes of Kierkegaard's Instant, for example (see 2007, 47), as well as this more recent book. "Death," Kangas writes in chapter six, "decides about me and I decide about death" (100). And yet it is the nature of decision, itself, that comes into radical question throughout Kangas's work. In an especially rich section, Kangas lays out Heidegger's indebtedness to Kierkegaard and then doubles back, granting the impossible by voicing Kierkegaard's response to Heidegger's take on death (108-111). Kierkegaard's dissent, rendered in Kangas's sparing and precise prose, displaces death-as-possibility with death-as-proximate: each moment becomes infinitely worthwhile in such proximity to death, but also incomplete and finite.
W. S. Merwin's tiny poem, "Elegy," consists of a single line fragment: "Who would I show it to" (1971, 137). This almost bald phrase invites us into a kind of elegy for elegy, "mourning the very conditions of possibility," as Ben Lerner puts it in a review of Merwin's book, for the transmission of grief in the face of death (2005). I am struck by the formal resonances between Merwin's elegy for elegy and the refrain of this book, found in every chapter. In chapter eight, for example, the need for something like an elegy for elegy becomes apparent through Kangas's reading of Kierkegaard's three discourses on The Lily of the Field and the Bird of the Air from 1849.
Kangas explains that the figure of the poet (a figure also conjured, in Merwin's poem, through the voice of the first person as the elegy's creator) is distinguished by Kierkegaard by a certain attunement to language: language as the ontological distinctiveness of human beings. This distinctiveness yields pain, however, because poetic speech is only ever an approximate and contingent expression of language in general (137). Just as decisions or wishes that solicit teleological futures miss the dynamics of temporality all together. Citing Kierkegaard, Kangas writes, "'The poet lets everything resonate in pain -- and this resonating of pain is the poem . . . the infinite resonating [of the pain] is in itself the poem'" (cited 138). In the following chapter, Kangas extends this reflection, writing:
An infinite sorrow escapes schematization in terms of speech horizons. The attempt to invest it within meaningful context, therefore, only intensifies, not relieves it. While the poet may take this sorrow as the condition of the poem, silence and obedience understand it as the exigency to let-go absolutely. (167)
So why is elegy in need of an elegy? As in the example of Merwin's poem "Elegy," the act of expressing poetic language (granting words to the lily or to the bird) is revealed by Kierkegaard to be ultimately a "tragic incantation" (139). Like elegy, on Kangas's account of Kierkegaard, knowledge "cannot place itself beyond the conditions of its possibility" (31). Put otherwise, the gift of being, or the leap of the decision, cannot be secured through knowledge (nor grief be shareable by way of an elegy). There is, however, the given. And this itself is the gift. We can only affirm the gift, Kangas writes, with "'a new beginning'" (28, citing Kierkegaard). And so, the poet, noted by Kangas to be one of Kierkegaard's original concepts, can be put under an epoché, bracketed as evading the more originary conditions of silence. While there is a deadlock or an elegiac impasse, in undergoing this deadlock, a different approach to the poet emerges: "The possibility of receiving the gift is already the gift" (38).
There is a superfluity to the religious discourses, Kangas explains (4), a "uselessness" that is non-normative, and yet still deeply practical (28). We could say, as readers, that an elegy for elegy emerges here that resists any simple return to language or attempts at representation (149). In a claim very close to Kangas's insights, Barthes points out, "To assign an Author to a text is to impose a brake on it, to furnish it with a final signified, to close writing" (1989, 53). But there is a striking divergence between Barthes and Kangas in the rest of this passage, where Barthes continues: "to refuse to halt meaning is finally to refuse God and his hypostases -- reason, science, the law" (1989, 54).
I want to be clear that Kangas's texts, including this book, might well exemplify the kind of refusal that Barthes is referring to here: refusals of ontotheology, for example, or even negative theology. In this book, for example, "God" is referred to as a placeholder (168), as wonder (84), as the choice of choice (158), as an encounter (77). God becomes more verb, than noun (39), in Kangas's interpretations of Kierkegaard's writings, placing Kierkegaard more in the theological line of Eckhart than Augustine (an interpretative choice that is hugely helpful, on my view). Kierkegaard makes use of his theological inheritance, according to Kangas (94), but does not substantiate the "God" that Barthes is indicting.
More significant, though, is that Kangas's placeholder-God undoes the very alliance between meaning, reason, science and law, presupposed by Barthes and by a great many other thinkers. One of Kangas's great achievements is to bracket such prevalent assumptions about metaphysical commitments. Kangas demonstrates that Kierkegaard's discourses are "critical and phenomenological" at their core (2). These discourses are "destructive," Kangas explains (6), in that they dismantle representational projects, and even the very quest of a project, by staging a "great overturning" -- which the reader, as well as the subject, undergoes (7). This is no standard or textbook description of existentialism. In fact, throughout the book, the very project of "the project" that tends to animate accounts of existentialist philosophies gives way, completely, to a much more dynamic understanding of becoming (see 47, 76 and 132).
Representation (like that of an elegy) is only a substitute for the "absolute future," Kangas writes (19). A wish anticipates the horizon, and "the future, precisely as a whole, constitutes this horizon at every point" (19). The open, surplus or surprise factor of the future's wholeness is what we, as existing humans, struggle with, intractably. Letting go, Kangas suggests, is the only way to enter into time completely (65). And yet, "at some time, there will be no time" (101). In this way, he explains, death throws life against itself, with no recourse, an ever-present possibility in each moment (103). There is an incompleteness to time, precisely because death is proximate, close by, impinging (109).
Faith in Kierkegaard's sense is "not only a refusal of the tragic, but its actual uprooting" (25). There is an excess to norms, a surplus to the "why" of life, that Kangas draws out of the religious discourses -- and with which he concludes the book, in a postscript. The postscript begins with a footnote in which Kangas points to a book, Broken Hegemonies by Reiner Schürmann, with which he is in close dialogue, a book also published posthumously (186, n1). In this postscript, Kangas anticipates a skeptical resistance that readers likely bring to the religious discourses: namely, the sense that Kierkegaard's use of the term "edifying" evinces an overly normative, even normalizing force. Taking up one of Schürmann's citations from Husserl, Kangas gives space to this concern, asking, "To what extent will a writer of edifying discourses, wittingly or not, assume the role of a 'civil servant of humanity,' one dedicated to making reassurances?" (169).
Kangas's response to this question reflects another of this book's valuable contributions to contemporary critical thought. There is a kind of edifying, we learn throughout the book and find articulated concisely in its postscript, which invokes not reassurance but the "whylessness of being" itself (171). Instead of learning how to die, such philosophy might be understood, through Kangas's Kierkegaard, as a redoubling repetition, one that points us not towards the tragic but towards groundless and errant affirmation. Recall that patience, for Kangas, is both condition and conditioned (58), and the possibility of receiving the gift is the gift (38). While this transcendentalizing account neither consoles nor reassures by appealing to norms, it does draw us into an immanent ethics. In this way, Kangas's reading resonates closely with the work of feminist thinkers like Elizabeth Grosz. In a recent interview, Grosz explains that while many philosophers strive "to separate the 'is' from the 'ought,'" in "an immanent ethics [like those developed by the pre-Socratics, Spinoza and Deleuze] . . . ethics is not separated from being or becoming: it is the modality or the manner of becoming, how and in what directions becomings occur" (Bell 2017, 242). I can't help but note that this account by Grosz invites an understanding of Kierkegaard's work that places it in close conversation with both Deleuze and Spinoza. More significantly, though, this modality of becoming is precisely what Kangas's book proffers, both in terms of the exegetical meaning that the religious discourses disclose, and also in terms of the blooming of the mortal flower (171). The book redresses an absence in scholarship that Kangas identifies at the close of Kierkegaard's Instant (2007, 198): the lack of philosophical attention to the edifying discourses that Kierkegaard wrote alongside his more theoretical texts. In addressing this absence, Kangas does more than fill a scholarly gap. He gives us the gift of a book that we can read, and again, seeking openness towards a kind of elegy that affirms the very finiteness of each moment.
Barthes, Roland. 1989. "The Death of the Author," The Rustle of Language. Trans. Richard Howard. University of California Press, 49-55.
Kangas, David J. 2007. Kierkegaard's Instant: On Beginnings. Indiana University Press.
Bell, Vikki. 2017. "An Interview with Elizabeth Grosz: 'The Incorporeal,'" Theory, Culture & Society 34(7-8): 237-243.
Lerner, Ben. 2005. "The Emptiness at the End," Jacket 28. Accessed June 10, 2018.
Merwin, W. S. 1971. The Carrier of Ladders. Atheneum.