2020.05.20

Rudolf Bernet

Force, Drive, Desire: A Philosophy of Psychoanalysis

Rudolf Bernet, Force, Drive, Desire: A Philosophy of Psychoanalysis, Sarah Allen (tr.), Northwestern University Press, 2020, 391pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810142237.

Reviewed by Daniel J. Smith, The University of Memphis


The relationship between philosophy and psychoanalysis has been an object of heated discussion for as long as the latter discipline has existed. Freud was famously suspicious of philosophy. Styling himself a hard-nosed man of science, he classed philosophy alongside superstition, religion, and myth as a prescientific way of thinking whose persistence in the modern world can be explained only by analogy with paranoid fantasy.[1] Among the various branches of philosophy, it was metaphysics that impressed him least. In his published work he wrote of the need to replace fanciful notions of "transcendental reality" with a scientific "psychology of the unconscious" and thereby "transform metaphysics into metapsychology" (ibid.); in private he confessed that

I not only have no talent for it (metaphysics) but no respect for it either. In secret -- one cannot say such things aloud -- I believe that one day metaphysics will be condemned as a nuisance, as an abuse of thinking, as a survival from the period of the religious Weltanschauung.[2]

Scholars have not always agreed with this self-assessment. Freud's acknowledged debt to Schopenhauer and Nietzsche has been the subject of much commentary, and studies exist comparing his key concepts to those of Plato, Descartes, Kant, Hegel, Kierkegaard, and countless others. Lacan's borrowings from the tradition are even more prodigious than Freud's, stretching from the pre-Socratics to contemporaries like Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze, and yet he is even more insistent in his opposition -- "I mistrust philosophizing like the plague", he says in a 1974 interview.[3] In his early work this generally comes out as a commitment to the clinical dimension of psychoanalysis; by his late period he is proclaiming himself an "anti-philosopher".[4]

Against the background of this fraught relationship, there have been many efforts to build bridges between philosophy and psychoanalysis, some more successful than others. Rudolf Bernet's ambitious book, originally published in French in 2013, ranks among the strongest of these attempts. This highly original study does not focus on the direct influence of particular philosophers on Freud and Lacan (the main representatives of Bernet's version of the psychoanalytic tradition), terrain which has by now been amply explored by others; instead, it works towards a speculative philosophical history of the psychoanalytic concept of "drive" [Trieb]. Bernet is interested less in the word and its etymology than he is in the varied ways in which the classical texts of Western metaphysics have tried to capture the reality it points to: "drive" has been said in many ways. As something constitutively unrealized so in some sense non-existent, but which nonetheless exerts a certain force or pressure on what does positively exist, "drives" have a rather peculiar metaphysical status. Tracking the history of attempts to conceptualise this kind of being, he avers, brings to light "a different history of metaphysics", one in which "the dynamic takes precedence over the static, restraint over actualization, lack (sterèsis) over accomplishment, and the presence of an absence over full presence" (4-5). Bernet, an inveterate and unapologetic philosopher, intervenes at the point where Freud was most hostile to philosophy, with the goal of "bringing psychoanalysis face to face with its philosophical heritage" (4) and showing that Freud "does metaphysics despite himself" (146). At the same time, his study convincingly contests the straw man of classical metaphysics as monolithically privileging substance, actuality, presence, etc. over their opposites (this latter focus is unfortunately elided by an odd translation of the title, which more literally would be: Force -- Drive -- Desire: Another Philosophy of Psychoanalysis). Part I of the book fashions a canon for this other history, tracing a line from Aristotle's notion of dunamis through Leibniz's vis activa and Schopenhauer's Wille to Freud's Trieb. Part II examines theories of the relationship between drives and the subject in Husserl, Freud again, and Schopenhauer/Nietzsche/Lacan in the final chapter.

The aim of the book is to construct "a philosophical genealogy of psychoanalysis" (4) -- a neat formula that seems to this reader to describe its project well. Like other well-known philosophical genealogies, it draws creative new connections that go beyond those that can be ascertained using traditional historical methods, exploring ideas that functioned only in an implicit, subterranean, or unconscious way. Bernet's story is far broader than one of mere influence; it is the narration of the centuries-long development of an idea, passing through writers who were not always reading each other, in all its rich complexity. And it is a complicated story: the almost 400 pages of text marshal an extraordinary quantity of source material to advance this new account. Many of the chapters explore multiple stages in the development of the figure they treat, documenting the proliferation of distinctions and shifting positions that characterize each philosopher's conception of drive-being. For better or worse, the book proceeds exclusively through the analysis of primary sources; the only secondary texts cited are by Heidegger and Lacan. It can be hard work -- at one point Bernet describes his own analysis as "laborious" (196) -- but that is par for the course for a genealogical project as ambitious as this one and does not detract from its achievement. Less welcome is the extent to which the analysis is often left to stand for itself, without being tied into the wider story. This sometimes works -- Part I fits together in a neat and intuitive way without the need for much signposting -- but not always. At certain points in the thicket of the Husserl chapter, for example, this reader lost the thread of the argument, left without a sense of how its many fine distinctions relate to the arc of the book as a whole. The introduction sets up the project beautifully; it is a shame there is no conclusion.

The first chapter is on Aristotle and focuses on the notion of dunamis (potentiality) in the Physics and Metaphysics theta. The aim is to grasp the being of dunamis "in itself", that is, in the various ways one might characterize its existence prior to its transition into actuality. This concept, Bernet thinks, is the key metaphysical precursor to the notion of "drive", which has a similar "virtual" status (real, but not actual). The analysis is rich and subtle, but reader, be warned: it is mostly about Heidegger. The bulk of the chapter is an account of the shifts in Heidegger's Aristotle-interpretation through the twenties and thirties, with close readings of passages in GA 62, 18, 22, 33, and 9, laced with commentary about how it relates to other aspects of his development. Readers of Heidegger interested in his analysis of Aristotle on potentiality and movement will find this chapter illuminating.

The second chapter is on Leibniz, whose notion of vis activa ("active force") Bernet sees as a reformulation of Aristotelian energeia in the new context of modern physics. For Bernet, Leibniz provides a better framework than Aristotle for understanding how a multiplicity of forces can act on the same substance, for introducing a richer vocabulary of different kinds of force including Keplerian inertia and the vis passiva ("passive force"), and for tying the metaphysics of force to the modern subject. The chapter also begins to introduce the concrete psychological and meta-psychological themes that will become so important for psychoanalysis in a remarkable subsection on desire, drive, and the pleasure principle that succeeds in making Locke sound just like Freud, and Leibniz just like Lacan (67-77).

The third chapter is on Schopenhauer and focuses on his idea of Wille ("will") as the metaphysical ground of all reality. Where he breaks from Leibniz is in seeing this will as wholly irrational, governed neither by the principle of sufficient reason nor by the optimistic presumption of a pre-established harmony guaranteeing complementarity between the desires of each individual substance. Bernet sees this Schopenhauerian element as a key ingredient of Freud's well-known insistence in the Three Essays that there is no "natural" form of sexual development free from deviation from a so-called normal. Schopenhauer's discussion of animal drives and other natural forces also demonstrates for Bernet that this alternative tradition is not caught up in the traditional metaphysical opposition between the human and the animal; "drives" are not exclusively a human reality but belong to a wider "philosophy of nature" (142).

The enormous first Freud chapter -- at 90 pages, long enough to be a short book all on its own -- is the centerpiece of the text, and the place where the historical analyses of the previous chapters begin to pay off. Bernet mobilises the concepts he had painstakingly developed via Aristotle, Leibniz, and Schopenhauer to chart a path through the three stages of Freud's drive theory, represented by the Three Essays on the Theory of Sexuality, Instincts and their Vicissitudes, and Beyond the Pleasure Principle, as well as numerous transitional texts. Bernet's own voice comes through most strongly in the sophisticated reading of Beyond the Pleasure Principle.

Like Lacan, Bernet rejects the dualism of Freud's account of vital drives and death drives and is tempted to see in the analysis of the latter the model for drives as such. He stops short of this Lacanian conclusion, however, because he wants to contest both Freud's interpretation of death drives in terms of a "Nirvana principle" (a reduction of drive pressure to nothing), and the connection between drives and aggressivity outlined in later texts such as Civilisation and its Discontents. Instead, he takes the novel approach of locating a "common root" (204) of this division of drives in the compulsion to repeat, which he calls "the pure drive" (214). Wanting neither pleasure nor death, this "nihilistic" (191) drive eternally strives for nothing but its own self-affirmation, and can never be satisfied, for reasons that are intrinsic to its being as drive: "for me, 'the drive' is precisely a reality characterized be its excess of 'unrealised' force, that is, by a 'dunamis' that is all the more pressing or violent given that no 'energeia' or actualization can use up its virtual power" (213).

As this passage shows, Bernet freely draws on his historical canon when outlining Freud's theory, often to criticize deficiencies in Freud and Lacan. For example, he argues that Lacan's reading of Instincts and Their Vicissitudes in seminar XI passes too quickly over the idea of drive "pressure" -- an essential component of Bernet's concept of "drive" -- but also that Freud himself mischaracterises it as a form of "activity", thereby placing it on the side of energeia rather than dunamis. This may seem a small point, but it is significant for Bernet's project, since it puts Freud's implied metaphysics on the track of quantitative energetics and naturalising biology rather than the intensive ontology of drives developed in the book; on this score he finds Freud "less precise" than Aristotle and Leibniz (175). While Bernet is obviously sympathetic to Freud's account of the drive, especially when supplemented by a certain reading of Lacan, his deeper allegiance is to this newly formed tradition of "dynamical metaphysics" (137), and he is not shy about criticizing the psychoanalysts wherever they seem to fail to live up to its insights.

Part II introduces the question of the subject of drives. This is a varied and quite different project, and in my view is not as novel or as focused as Part I. Chapter 5 establishes some interesting and unexpected similarities between Husserl and Freud but does not go beyond the model of drawing comparisons. The second Freud chapter explains how the subject of drives should not be identified with the conscious ego, which Bernet sees as merely a "corrective intervention" (257) on a deeper "subject of the unconscious". Unlike Part I, which took a genuinely novel approach to writing a philosophical history of psychoanalysis, the problem of the subject in Freud and Lacan has been explored by many others, and so one feels more strongly the choice not to engage with any other commentators.[5] The final chapter addresses the sublimation of drives through art in Schopenhauer, Nietzsche and Lacan. The question of what we do with our drives is obviously a significant offshoot of the question of what drives are, but it isn't clear to me that artistic sublimation is the only, or even the most pressing related issue to address in a final chapter. Why, for example, does it take priority over the ethical, cultural, and political issues which have been discussed through the history of the psychoanalytic tradition? Chapter 6 ends with a tantalizing gesture towards the problem of "the ethics of desire" (300) -- the main subject of Lacan's seminar VII -- but it goes no further than that.

A book with the sweeping ambition of this one will inevitably spark many additional connections for the interested reader beyond those explored in the book. Part of the value of a canon-forming work such as this one is to open up a generative debate on the question of who ought to belong to such a tradition. Still, more discussion of why particular figures were and were not chosen would have been welcome, especially given that Bernet's speculative method allows him to cast his net rather wider than others. For example, given the focus on dynamic metaphysics and the philosophy of nature, why no Schelling? Three major studies have recently made the case that Schelling, rather than Leibniz or Schopenhauer, is the philosopher whose metaphysics stands behind the psychodynamic notion of the unconscious.[6] Or, given the book's focus on drives, why centre the discussion of Nietzsche on the Birth of Tragedy rather the drive-theory of middle-period texts such as Dawn, which have received renewed attention in recent years? Finally, why devote a chapter to a comparison with Husserl rather than the other major philosophical influences like Sartre, Bergson, and Deleuze? Bernet may well have good answers to these questions, but we do not know because these choices, like many others, are left unexplained.

The exclusive focus on primary texts also leaves one wondering how Bernet's project relates to other attempts to open a dialogue between philosophy and psychoanalysis. In addition to classic studies like Paul Ricoeur's Freud and Philosophy, Jonathan Lear's Freud, and Michel Henry's Genealogy of Psychoanalysis, there exists a range of quite brilliant recent work that not only addresses this relationship in creative new ways, but even does so primarily from the ontological perspective that is of interest to Bernet. Examples would include books by Alenka Zupančič, particularly the marvelous Why Psychoanalysis? and more recent What is Sex?; Catherine Malabou's engagement with psychoanalysis, particularly The New Wounded and Self and Emotional Life; and finally Adrian Johnston's Time Driven, a study of the notion of "drive" in Freud that is deeply informed by debates about ontology in contemporary philosophy. One can appreciate the focus that comes with an exclusive attention to primary texts while regretting these many missed encounters.

The final critical question I would like to raise concerns Bernet's stance with respect to metaphysics itself. Bernet belongs to that tradition of philosophy that is deeply invested in overcoming metaphysics, and he sees this book as contributing to that project, in its own way. His account of the drive, he writes, "no longer lends itself to the hierarchy of opposing concepts of traditional metaphysics, nor does it remain fascinated by the shining presence of an active and positive force for perfection" (15). However, at many other times, including in passages I have already cited, Bernet uses terms that make it seem like its project is a continuation of metaphysics, and indeed, perhaps even a contestation of the characterization of metaphysics as uniformly determined by things like hierarchies of concepts and positive drives for perfection. To be fair, he does try to address this problem at one point in the introduction, where he describes his project as developing a "fundamental ontology of the drive . . . which I hold to be more fundamental than any ontology of the human subject or Dasein" (14). This is an interesting and provocative suggestion, but it doesn't quite work. If the idea is to give an absolute ontological priority to the notion of drive -- to characterize drive-being as "primal reality" [Ursein], in the way that someone like Schelling would have done -- then the project is not at all an overcoming of metaphysics but an instance of it. If it is merely to give an account of the being of drives, then it is not a fundamental ontology but a regional one, even if those drives are taken to be prior to other important concepts like the subject or Dasein. This tension would dissipate completely were one to read the book as an exercise in historically informed metaphysics focusing on the concept of drive -- nothing wrong with that! -- but that would require abandoning what seem to be deeply held commitments.

These issues aside, Bernet's book makes for essential reading on the topic of the relationship between philosophy and psychoanalysis; many of the chapters are sure to become standard points of reference, at least for those who are a bit more generous in their citation of other scholars. This book does more than just shed new light on a much-debated question; it opens up a new area of research. Bernet has a truly impressive mastery of the texts of classical metaphysics which he expertly weaves into an alternative tradition. The book sometimes takes a circuitous route to approach its goal, but like drives themselves, this detour produces an abundant surplus not always connected to its object that nevertheless generates a pleasure all of its own.


[1] Sigmund Freud, The Standard Edition of the Complete Psychological Works of Sigmund Freud vol. VI, The Psychopathology of Everyday Life trans. James Strachey (London: W.W. Norton, 1971), 309.

[2] Letter to Werner Achelis, January 30, 1927.

[3] Jacques Lacan, The Triumph of Religion trans. Bruce Fink (Cambridge: Polity, 2013), 84.

[4] Jacques Lacan, "Monsieur A.", Ornicar?, 20/21 (1980), 17.

[5] See the very different approaches to this question in, e.g., the volume Cogito and the Unconscious ed. Slavoj Žižek (London: Duke University Press, 1998); Bruce Fink, The Lacanian Subject (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1996); Lorenzo Chiesa, Subjectivity and Otherness: A Philosophical Reading of Lacan (Cambridge: MIT Press, 2007).

[6] Matt Ffytche, The Foundation of the Unconscious: Schelling, Freud, and the Birth of the Modern Psyche (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2012); Sean McGrath, The Dark Ground of Spirit: Schelling and the Unconscious (New York: Routledge, 2012); Teresa Fenichel, Schelling, Freud, and the Philosophical Foundations of Psychoanalysis (New York: Routledge, 2018).