2020.06.13

Samuel Talcott

Georges Canguilhem and the Problem of Error

Samuel Talcott, Georges Canguilhem and the Problem of Error, Palgrave MacMillan, 2019, 294pp., $89.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783030007782.

Reviewed by Paul M. Livingston, University of New Mexico


Under current global conditions, it is hardly necessary to belabor the immediate relevance of the work of a twentieth-century philosopher who focused, throughout his career, on problems of collective thought and practice at the intersections of ethics, politics and biomedicine. But as Samuel Talcott's admirable new study exhaustively shows, Georges Canguilhem's sustained effort to analyze the concepts of health, normalcy, and sociopolitical activity also bears important broader lessons for contemporary philosophers engaged in critically thinking about the logical and historical structure of scientific knowledge in its relationship to life.

Canguilhem was trained in medicine as well as philosophy, and one aim of his work on the logic, epistemology, and history of the concepts of the life sciences and psychology is to trace out the meaning of these concepts as they are lived in the concrete situations and contexts in which they bear directly on the life and health of human beings. As Talcott convincingly argues, though, Canguilhem's project also amounts to a kind of engaged philosophical therapeutics directed against pervasive forms of alienation, existential disorientation, suffering and world-loss. These forms are especially marked in the lived realities of sickness, injury, and disease, but, as Canguilhem recognizes, they are also ubiquitous in contemporary life and structurally characterize some of its most dominant institutions, ideologies, and practices.

In 1929, the young Canguilhem envisioned the use of philosophy's reflection on our concepts as potentially able to "arouse thought in the human individual for whom it enlarges organic life and reattaches him to the universe via his perception and his ardor" (p. 77). For Canguilhem, this organicist and holistic restoration is continuous with the aims of medicine in restoring health both on individual and cultural levels. But it can be attained only through careful and rigorous philosophical work of critical thinking about the social, institutional and historical realities that constitute pathology and alienation as they are collectively understood and maintained in intimate connection with the categories of the "normal", "regular," and healthy. As Talcott argues throughout the book and as Canguilhem suggested in a 1934 course, a central method of this rigorous critical thinking is that of interrogating the potentially positive value of those experiences and realities of our lived epistemic relation to the world -- including those of error, irrationality, and fiction -- that are more routinely dismissed as purely negative in the course of positivist and reconstructive epistemology (p.  79). Here and elsewhere, Canguilhem insists on a conception of both human and animal life whereon it does not have the primary meaning of an object for scientific or philosophical study, but rather a basic source and grounding of value in and through its own spontaneous activity of defense and struggle, and for a correlative sense of the aim of philosophical reflection and critical questioning, engagement, and resistance.

Canguilhem is often associated, especially in recent scholarship, with the (chiefly French) tradition of historical epistemology that is seen as also including Koyré, Bachelard, Cavaillès, and (sometimes) Lautman. There is sometimes also a tendency to read Canguilhem primarily or exclusively looking backward from Foucault, whose thesis on the history of madness, later published as Folie et déraison and then in English as Madness and Civilization, was sponsored by Canguilhem, at the suggestion of Hyppolite.[1] Wisely, however, Talcott resists both of these interpretive tendencies, preferring instead to let Canguilhem's philosophical methods and results speak for themselves and emerge in their complexity and specificity through the detailed analysis of his writings over the course of his career. It is true that these methods owe much to the tradition of a historical "working of the concept" that Canguilhem inherited from his predecessors, including Bachelard (whom Canguilhem succeeded as Professor of History and Philosophy of Sciences and director of the Institute for the History of Sciences and Techniques at the Sorbonne in 1955).[2] But the exclusive location of Canguilhem's methods within the context of this kind of practice of epistemology threatens to efface both the specificity of his sustained engagement with the life sciences and, as Talcott argues, many of the broader ethical and specifically sociopolitical implications of this engagement. As Talcott argues and demonstrates over the course of his analysis, these implications can only emerge clearly if Canguilhem is understood, not primarily as the representative of any fixed epistemological method or as the mere harbinger of more radical projects to come, but rather as a philosopher essentially and comprehensively "concerned with the entire range of possible human experiences, activities, and values" (p. x) and capable of bringing this kind of concern to the whole field of his wide-ranging analyses of the concepts of knowledge in their essential relation to the constitutive activities of life.

An illustrative and relevant example of this integration of Canguilhem's philosophical and conceptual methodology with broadly sociopolitical concerns can be found in his 1943 essay, submitted as the thesis for his doctoral degree in medicine, on "Some Problems Concerning the Normal and the Pathological." In the first part of the essay, Canguilhem takes as his critical target a thesis, broadly characteristic of thought about the normal and the pathological since the nineteenth century, according to which the pathological condition of a person or animal is to be understood as essentially the same as its normal or (in this sense) non-pathological state, except for purely quantitative variations.[3] Canguilhem's objection to this position is not that it is simply false, but that it presupposes that this presumed normal state can itself be defined in a purely objective and factual way. More broadly, as Canguilhem argues, it is necessary to distinguish clearly what is called normal in the sense of mere statistical averageness or numerical prevalence from the normative, in the quite different sense in which it is possible to say that life proposes its own norms for itself. In this latter sense, life itself, in its own "normative activity," is and must be the ultimate source for all judgments of what is "normal."[4] As Canguilhem suggests, the specific aims of the sciences of pathology and physiology, and the broader ends of medicine -- that of the recognition of sickness, disease, and pathology as the world-transforming alienation of life from the value that it proposes for itself and the restoration of this fundamental activity of valuing -- are badly served if this fundamental conceptual distinction is missed.

Talcott's book is organized around a series of specific areas of activity and research in which Canguilhem was able to locate and pursue this engagement over the course of his career. Interestingly, but appropriately, he begins the analysis with a discussion of Canguilhem's substantial and important political engagements, which spanned World War II (during which Canguilhem served admirably in the Resistance), the French war against Algeria's independence, and the crisis leading to the replacement of the parliamentary fourth republic with de Gaulle's more authoritarian fifth republic in 1958. These engagements were, as Talcott shows, grounded in his idea of justice as a kind of higher, trans-organismic health, calling for both specific theoretical treatments of the organizing concepts of the state and societies of control and more concrete interventions in contemporary political affairs. In a series of articles written amidst the crisis of 1958, Canguilhem insists upon the fundamental impossibility of a just organization of society founded upon the continuing existence of colonialist oppression and the techniques it employs for deploying and exerting domination. Here, as Canguilhem carefully notes, the mechanisms of state and political control are themselves prone to adopt the rhetoric or practices they associate with a scientific regulation of human behavior in order to serve their larger aims of interpellation, discipline, and regulation. It is accordingly necessary for an appropriate philosophical response, on behalf of justice, to thematize and study the place and role of scientific knowledge in cultural activity more broadly, including the interests behind the privileging of narrowly technical knowledge or expertise over disciplines emphasizing more individual, personal, or anthropological reflection.

Stepping back historically, chapters 2 and 3 of Talcott's study take up the development of these interlinked political, epistemological, and metaphysical views over the 1930s and 40s. Throughout this period, as Talcott documents, Canguilhem deepens his reflections on the history of the concepts of biology and their complex relationship to the philosophical standpoint of vitalism, while maintaining an underlying anti-fascism and a specialized form of Marxism as the political underpinnings of these engagements. Chapter 4 explores some of the deeper metaphysical resonances of Canguilhem's emergent philosophy of life in relation to the problems of creation and creativity, especially in connection with Canguilhem's complex relationship with the thought of Bergson. In chapter 5, Talcott turns to the understanding that Canguilhem would develop of the biological sciences and the complex and situated conditions of what he sees as their creative and genuine production of knowledge of life in the later 1940s and early 1950s. An important aspect of Canguilhem's 1952 book Knowledge of Life is his development and employment of the concept of the milieu, or the irreducibly contextual situations in which living beings organize and orient the activities of their lives and lived realities. In the specific context of the activities of natural and life sciences, this implies a close investigation of the milieu of the laboratory and of the specific constitution and limits of practices of experimentation. Here, Canguilhem anticipates much later work in the philosophy of science by understanding the progress of biological science not simply as the application of given experimental concepts but rather as constituting biological concepts through the complex conditions of experimentation, both in laboratory and clinical settings.

In chapters 6 through 8, Talcott traces the continuing development of Canguilhem's practice of simultaneously rational and historical reflection on the structure and provenance of the concepts of biology and psychology in the 1950s, with methodological glances backward to Bachelard and forward to Foucault. In his 1955 history of the concept of reflex, Canguilhem's careful historical work also amounts, as Talcott suggests, to a critical re-inscription of the history of mechanism within a broader history of life. Here again, Canguilhem's detailed historical investigation of a determining paradigm of biological explanation reveals a much broader practical and critical sociopolitical aim: here, as Talcott suggests, that of providing an effective position of conceptual resistance to the mechanization of the human being in industrial society. This illustrates, as Talcott says, how for Canguilhem the history of science never simply elaborates a pure history of concepts or attempts to reflect the historical development of a purely disinterested truth, but rather essentially treats particular scientific truths and concepts in their tendencies to allow for "the domination, securing, or flourishing of life" (p. 198). Yet unlike some of his successors, Canguilhem never gives up on the potential of scientific knowledge, if carefully understood in its historical context and conceptual structure, to contribute positively to the enhancement of human value and serve those vital ends.

In the last two chapters, Talcott examines some of Canguilhem's later and more summative writings about biomedical concepts and practices in their broad implications for contemporary social and political life. In his 1959 article "Therapeutics, Experimentation, Responsibility," Canguilhem appears presciently to anticipate the contemporary sociopolitical situation in which industrial-scale biomedical technology and its ever-growing imbrication in everyday life lead to a problematic de facto inseparability of its imperatives from the political project of the administration, regulation, and control of individual and collective life. Because of the way technological medicine increasingly becomes a phenomenon pursued and developed at the scale of industrial society as a whole (Canguilhem wrote in 1959), "choices of a political character are implied in all debates concerning the relations of man and medicine." Accordingly, decisions and positions taken about the role of biomedicine in collective life also necessarily imply a whole host of decisions about the "structure of society, institutions of hygiene and social security," and, indeed, the "future of humanity" itself (p. 238).

In the current global pandemic crisis, few claims could, of course, appear more prescient; and if Canguilhem's methods, as we have seen, characteristically work by carefully and rigorously analyzing the history of the concepts constitutive of biomedical knowledge, it is equally evident from this how an appreciation of Canguilhem's methods might well serve critical reflection on the manifold political and social problems that the biomedical administration of life effectively poses today. Contemporary philosophers such as Giorgio Agamben, who inherits Canguilhem's engagement with the problems of biomedicine and politics largely through the mediating term of Foucault's biopolitical paradigm, have recently called for such an urgent reflection on the contemporary political agendas of the articulation and administration of life. Evidently, though, considerations drawn from Canguilhem's own work -- for example, his rigorous critique, in the 1943 essay, of conceptions of the "normal" couched only in terms of statistically normal functioning -- can provide further useful terms for interrogating prevalent conceptions that tend to see the current crisis as simply the forced interruption of a life of capitalist practice and consumption that is "normal" in this sense.

With respect to all of these dimensions and still-relevant implications of Canguilhem's thought and work, Talcott's study provides a comprehensive, perceptive and revealing overview and guide. There are times at which a reader may wish for a more systematic overall organization of the central themes of Canguilhem's work; and it is not clear that the concept or problem of error itself, which Talcott foregrounds, genuinely has the deeply determining significance for Canguilhem that Talcott maintains. But these small criticisms are to be tempered by an appreciation, which Talcott's book also more than adequately provides, of the great diversity of the contexts and applications that Canguilhem himself envisions for his philosophical and conceptual work. In a late article on thought and the brain, Canguilhem writes that the specific task of philosophy is "not to increase thinking's output or yield [rendement], but to remind it of the meaning of its power."[5] If this definition may be indeed be upheld as giving both a general articulation and a specific meaning to the relevant work of philosophical reflection in relation to the broadest contemporary problems of collective practice and action, then Talcott's careful and revealing examination of Canguilhem offers a highly illuminating and vital contribution to this essential work of philosophy, as it is evidently and globally required today.


[1] Stuart Elden, Canguilhem. Cambridge: Polity Press, 2019, p.

[2] The phrase to "work a concept" [travailler un concept] is Canguilhem's, from a 1963 article on Bachelard: see, e.g., Peter Hallward's introduction to Volume One of Concept and Form, ed. by Peter Hallward and Knox Peden, London: Verso, 2012, p. 13.

[3] Georges Canguilhem, The Normal and the Pathological. Translated by Carolyn R. Fawcett and Robert S. Cohen, New York: Zone Books, 1991, p. 35.

[4] The Normal and the Pathological, p. 127.

[5] Georges Canguilhem, "The Brain and Thought." Translated by Steven Corcoran and Peter Hallward. Radical Philosophy 148 (March/April 2008), pp. 7-18.