2020.03.15

John E. Drabinski

Glissant and the Middle Passage: Philosophy, Beginning, Abyss

John E. Drabinski, Glissant and the Middle Passage: Philosophy, Beginning, Abyss, University of Minnesota Press, 2019, 243pp., $27.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781517905989.

Reviewed by Al-Yasha Ilhaam Williams, Spelman College


"Lacuna" is a word often used to describe the gap in scholarship on the Middle Passage. This intellectual void, acknowledged across disciplines, may be in part a result of a failure to address the psychosocial weight of the trauma-laden specialty area, further complicated by vestiges of a disingenuous academic methodology that privileges maritime records as primary sources. This practice uses the shield of academic standards for archival accuracy and documentation to further marginalize the lost voices of African captives by literally centering the master narrative and defining the few, precious slave narratives that exist as inadequate, inconsistent, fragmented and incomplete human memories confined to the periphery. Fortunately, a new approach has emerged in the 21st century, a development of 19th century Continental philosophy in conversation with 20th century Africana studies and postcolonial theory. This approach centers the Caribbean and utilizes Caribbean-derived language and theory to elucidate the complex range of existential crises engendered by the Middle Passage that have thus far been unrecorded, unpublished, forgotten, or otherwise lost at sea. In the introduction to a new collection entitled Classicisms in the Black Atlantic, (OUP, 2020) Emily Greenwood writes, "the Middle Passage is blank space, archival lacuna, silent noise, the story written on water, the underwater epic, the tale that cannot and yet must be told."

With John E. Drabinski's recent book, a substantial and convincing effort to fill this lacuna has emerged. Following his edited collection Theorizing Glissant: Sites and Citations (Creolizing the Canon) (Rowman & Littlefield, 2015), this text puts Drabinski at the forefront of a growing cohort of scholars who are forging a brave and rigorous new way through the waters of the Middle Passage. The work includes references to at least twelve of Glissant's major works, five of which are the author's translations. Engaging the Negritude-informed writings of the Caribbean, Drabinski follows Glissant's philosophy of creolization by incorporating and decentering the Continental tradition to privilege an archipelagic context, a fragmented, multidimensional perspective for theorizing Caribbean studies as its locality, the islands.

Born in Sante-Marie, Martinique in 1928, Eduard Glissant studied history and philosophy at the Sorbonne and ethnography at the Musee de l'Homme. His political activity led to the French government putting him under suspicion and having his movement within the country restricted for a period of several years, after which he returned to Martinique and made his way back to the academy. As a Distinguished Professor of French at the CUNY Graduate Center he divided his time between New York, Paris and Martinique. While greatly influenced by Aime Cesaire, he was established early on as a critic of African-centric Negritude, proposing the concept of "relational poetics" which in turn provided the foundation for "creolitè", an anti-essentialist view which takes into account the multiple cultures and influences that form Caribbean identity. Creolitè has since grown to encompass a wide domain within and beyond Diaspora studies. Glissant's poetry is regarded as exemplary Caribbean literature, but it is noteworthy that as a theorist, Glissant is often claimed by the Continent and considered a French philosopher, ostensibly in reference to his education and language of publication.

Drabinski's book has five chapters, with two devoted to "Origins", two to the "Abyssal Subject", and the last to the synthesis of ideas toward a definition of intellectualism as subjectivity. He introduces the text with Glissant's concept of opacity, the tenuous and contested space of definition and identity. Where the study of the Middle Passage once emphasized that which could be known and documented, opacity insists that there is something in the existential experience that remains vague, untranslatable, unknowable, and thus makes a virtue of ambiguity. "The opacity of meaning refers both to the knowable and the unknowable of the past and those ways in which they are folded into the present, yes, but opacity, by way of Relation, also opens upon a future without closure" (17). Drabinski claims that opacity can be observed in four forms: as the site or non-site of loss, as an anticolonial strategy and space of resistance, as a structure for creolization, and as constituting the possibility of Relation, Glissant's "signature idea" from Poetics of Relation (U. Mich. 1997) translated from the French Poètique de la Relation (Gallimard 1990). Opacity is such a defining feature of the Caribbean condition that the oppressed can assert a "right to opacity" (13), in opposition to a posited or assumed Heideggerian "legibility." This idea is compared with Derek Walcott's storytelling ethos and with Franz Fanon's attention to the "mimetic impulse" of the colonized (75).

From this vantage point, the concept of the abyssal comes to the fore. The "abyssal subject" exists in fragments, at the unreachable bottom of the ocean. Chapter Three contains the largest exploration of philosophical themes, highlighting the influence of Deleuze and Guattari's A Thousand Plateaus: Capitalism and Schizophrenia (University of Minnesota, 1987), which gave us, among other ideas, the rhizome (the space of liminal existence and change) and the nomad (an entity drifting between worlds, seeking a sense of place within constant uprootedness. In Poetics of Relation, Glissant poses a "creolization of rhizome and nomad" (101), the contested space and the displaced person.

In the consideration of the abyss, the outlines of opacity, Relation, creolization, rhizome, nomad and the abyss provide a rich conceptual framework for the analysis of Negritude and Francophone literatures. Drabinski's analysis really takes flight in the fourth chapter, on the subject of aesthetics and the abyssal subject, featuring an excellent consideration and comparison/contrast of Aime Cesaire and George Lamming. Grounded in a Hegelian reading of DuBois (who was himself reconciling his double-consciousness with a reading of The Phenomenology of the Spirit), this chapter offers a more robust description of creolization as distinct from "creolitè", in much the way that Antillanitè breaks from the nostalgia of Negritude. In so doing, the fragmentary nature of the new world is recognized with the identification of disruption, exile and dislocation. In a careful consideration of film director Raoul Peck's work on the Congolese leader and revolutionary Patrice Lumumba in both documentary and feature form, Drabinski proposes viewing the aspects of African identity, French colonialism, and American economic interests which have defined the Congo region in a political identity distinctly grounded in its exploration of Negritude from the vantage point of the undefined, uncommitted abyss.

The concluding chapter leads the reader to consider the capacity for poiesis. Here Drabinski engages with Glissant's critics, who asserted in his later years that he had substituted a revolutionary potential in creolization for a global, rather than national, perspective. The resistance of creolization to political ends brought about the accusation that a Deleuzean universalist methodology was behind a politically uncommitted notion of creolization. Such nationalist and essentialist tendencies are almost always at odds with an existentialist critique, and to the extent that Glissant does not lead in the same direction as Fanon, Drabinski maintains that where Negritude fetishized a cohesive African identity, creolization refuses this essentialist move.

This is where Glissant's contrast with Negritude, and particularly with Fanon's (perhaps ironic) transformation of it into a fetishization of revolutionary (rather than vitalist) Africa becomes important. The need, and this is such a peculiar word for Glissant to use, for unity fails to take up the possibilities dispersion gives to thinking. Nostalgia for a prior unity or a unity to come, which is nothing other than seeking a temporal space in which to set stable roots of organicity for intellectual work, cannot take the archipelagic geography of reason seriously as a figurative and literal condition of the Caribbean. (204-5)

Glissant's rightful claim as a philosopher is substantiated by his education and recognition among some of the most influential thinkers in French philosophy. Unfolding in a series of layered descriptions of the ocean, the island, the archipelago and the displaced post-Continental subject, Drabinski takes up the project inaugurated by Paget Henry's philosophical approach to Caribbean literature in Caliban's Reason: An Introduction to Caribbean Philosophy (Routledge, 2000), in which Henry notes: "creolization raises explicitly the issue of power relations in determining the ways in which African, Indian and European philosophies come together to constitute a regional philosophy." The consortium of Caribbean philosophers established a few years later as the Caribbean Philosophical Association continues the important work of connecting Continental and archipelagic thinking toward the articulation of a Caribbean existential condition and literary poetics.

Middle Passage studies continue to be among the more contested areas of interdisciplinary research. Like archipelagic topography, it exists in fragments, which are always in the process of being collected. The physical topography of the Caribbean is described as fragmented, broken, damaged; these characteristics map onto the human experience of trauma and dislocation. Emerging from relative obscurity, slave narratives and oral histories are increasingly recognized as critical documents of the Middle Passage. Recently, as if called forth by séance, Zora Neal Hurston's Barracoon: The Story of the Last "Black Cargo" (Amistad, 2018) emerged from the depths of Harlem Renaissance history to see publication. It is no small miracle the discourse has shifted to a point that it's now possible for Hurston's research and Cudjoe Lewis's lost voice to be recovered.

Drabinski has composed a work of exceptional depth that is yet fathomable, in remarkably beautiful prose, given the severity of the subject matter. The translations of Glissant's writing are both by the author and by several noted Glissant scholars, including the late J. Michael Dash. On a subject that could for centuries find no purchase, the author has given to 21st century philosophy, of all fields, a treatment of the Middle Passage from a major Caribbean thinker with a rich, existential, deliberately non-reductionist description of the forced migration of African peoples. The work is nuanced and detailed, and provides several avenues forward in the continuation of his expedition into the complex waters of the Middle Passage. Within the grim history of forced migration and slavery lies a gentle, lyrical composition whose depth of inquiry yields beautiful truths, genuine struggles, and always, the possibility of moving from dislocation to connection, from the ocean's abyss to the island's shore.