István Aranyosi addresses issues in the philosophy of religion in an unusually creative way, taking a path through logic, the philosophy of language, and the philosophy of mind to sweeping and highly original conclusions. His book is packed with novel insights and approaches. The presentation is concise, indeed, at times, compressed. Many of the arguments could have profited from a more extended treatment. Still, this is a remarkably ambitious and innovative book. The first part, dealing mostly with metaphysics and the philosophy of logic, presents Aranyosi's conception of logical space. The second part, dealing mostly with the philosophy of mind, develops aspects of logical space in presenting a unique treatment of the mind-body problem. The third part, dealing mostly with the philosophy of religion, outlines a new version of pantheism that, Aranyosi argues, solves the problem of evil, answers objections to traditional forms of pantheism, and gives an attractive account of religious practice and religious tolerance.
Here are some of Aranyosi's most central contentions:
1. Logical Totalitarianism: Logical Space is the sum of all logical regions, the Absolute Plenitude, reflecting all possibilities.
2. Logical Egalitarianism: All objects and states of affairs in logical space have an equal claim to being.
3. Existential Relativity: To exist is to exist relative to a region of logical space.
4. Ontic Deflationism: To be is to so-be: to exist relative to a region of logical space is to be depicted in that region.
5. Nesting: Logical Space is nested, in the sense that it contains alternative canonical logical spaces.
6. Transistence: Logical Space is folded, in the sense that things existing in a region can have causal influence outside the region in which they exist.
7. Reality: Logical Space is the only ultimately real existent; the ontic properties of everything else are grounded in Logical Space.
8. Logical Spillover: Circumstances in a region of Logical Space permit us to draw conclusions about its entire canonical logical space.
9. Logical Pantheism: God and Logical Space are identical.
Aranyosi sometimes uses the image of God's drawing board as a metaphor for logical space. These theses then amount to the claims that God's drawing board contains all possibilities; that everything on God's drawing board has an equal claim to be; that to be is to be depicted in a region of the drawing board; that the drawing board has vertical and horizontal dimensions, which relate in intricate ways; and that, in the end, God is just the drawing board.
Aranyosi rests his entire view on his conception of Logical Space. Inspired by Wittgenstein, he thinks of Logical Space as the space containing all possibilities. This does not mean, however, the set of all possible worlds. He does not resolve questions about the proper form of logic: whether there are truth value gaps or gluts, for example, or whether vagueness is an ontological, epistemic, or linguistic matter. All competing conceptions of logical space can find a home within his Logical Space. So, we should not think of Logical Space as a set of possible worlds but rather as "an abstract space that is invariant under, that is closed under, any logical operation on any proposition whatsoever" (13). It contains a class of canonical logical spaces, where those vary according to the conceptions they reflect.
Aranyosi's thesis of Logical Totalitarianism suggests an analogy with theories of truth, propositions, properties, and sets, which raises the worry that Logical Space, as he characterizes it, is not well-defined. As Tarski observed, the universality of natural languages -- their ability to talk about anything that can be talked about at all -- is the source of the liar paradox (Tarski 1956, 164-165). Does the universality of Aranyosi's idea of Logical Space similarly lead to paradox? Since his characterization is informal, it is hard to answer that question with any precision. It is unclear what he would do with 'This proposition is false,' for example.
We might start with his argument for a broader conception of logical space. Suppose we were to think of it as an infinite set of possible worlds. How could we use it to represent sentences such as 'There are no possible worlds' or 'There are finitely many possible worlds' (10-11), or, arguably worse, 'There might have been no possible worlds' or 'There might have been only finitely many possible worlds'? The difficulty, from one point of view, is that we cannot use the framework to give an adequate representation of sentences about the framework itself, and especially about the modal properties of the framework.
Aranyosi thinks of Logical Space as a class of canonical logical spaces (CLSs), one of which would be the standard space of infinitely many possible worlds. But why does his argument against the standard framework fail to apply at this level? How can we represent sentences about Logical Space? 'Logical Space might have contained only finitely many CLSs'; 'no objects exist in more than one CLS'; 'God is Logical Space'; 'God is not Logical Space'; 'Logical Space exists within the mind of God'; how exactly do we represent and evaluate these propositions in his framework? And, if we can do it successfully, why can't the advocate of a more standard picture use the same strategy? I suspect that answering these questions, and reassuring us that Logical Space as Absolute Plenitude is a consistent notion, would require working this conception out formally against a background of Morse-Kelley set theory, since the most promising idea would probably be to treat Logical Space as a class of classes.
Almost a third of the book consists of an examination of issues in the philosophy of mind. This section is interesting, but largely independent of the final third of the book, which deals with the philosophy of religion.
Aranyosi elaborates the thought that Logical Space is folded in such a way that states of affairs existing at a region of Logical Space can interact causally with states of affairs in other regions of Logical Space even without existing in those regions. He calls this transistence. Aranyosi cites the Thomas Theorem, which he generalizes to the thesis that how we define a situation has an impact on our situation. If people think of something nonexistent as actual, then it is actual in its effects, and present in the actual world despite its nonexistence (52). Thus, if everyone believes in a God with certain characteristics, the world will become as if there were a God with those characteristics, whether or not there actually is. In his terms, this is a matter of that God, existing in some region of Logical Space, influencing another region of Logical Space.
There is, of course, an alternative: to say that people's beliefs and definitions of situations influence their behavior and thus the world without appeal to nonexistent objects. What influences the world in the above example, on this picture, isn't the God that exists in some other world or some other region of Logical Space but the mental states and events of people in this world. Aranyosi denies that we can make sense of the causal power of those mental states and events without appeal to locally nonexistent objects, because that power depends on their content, and their content involves such objects.
Aranyosi thus introduces the idea of a logical object, and thinks of attitude ascriptions as describing relations to such objects. He also introduces the idea of a standing quantifier, uses it to criticize Fregean and Russellian approaches, and employs his theory to show how Lois Lane can believe that Superman can fly without believing that Clark Kent can fly, or even how someone who knows that Clark Kent and Superman are the same person can hope Superman saves the day without hoping that Clark Kent saves the day. He uses his view to explain how we can say true things about fictional characters, even things relating them to real objects.
Certain aspects of his treatment are insightful, giving us new strategies for thinking through attitude reports, modalities, and intentional objects. Others are puzzling. He analyzes 'John believes that Superman might be identical to Clark Kent, and Superman might be in the building' in terms that reduce to
John believes that (Clark Kent is in the building or Clark Kent is not in the building or Superman is in the building or Superman is not in the building)
which seems counterintuitive. What happened to the epistemic modality? And is what John believes a tautology? What counts as a tautology on this conception, anyway?
The final section of the book argues for Logical Pantheism, the view that God is Logical Space. Aranyosi finds inspiration and precedent for this view in Sufism, Pseudo-Dionysius, Meister Eckhart, Nicholas of Cusa, and others. It allows him to say that God is Absolute Plenitude, containing all possibilities at once.
Aranyosi begins with a subtle analysis of the modal ontological argument and criticisms thereof, concluding that the argument succeeds only if we identify God with Logical Space. Most theists would surely shrug this off; so much the worse for the modal ontological argument. But Aranyosi argues that Logical Pantheism explicates the sense in which God is the Greatest Conceivable Being. It also, he contends, explains why there is something rather than nothing; how God is the ground of Being; and how God's existence is compatible with the existence of evil. Indeed, he argues that the problem of evil, and even of possible evil, is insoluble on other grounds. Logical Space of course contains evil, because it is maximal; anything that contained no evil would fail to be the Absolute Plenitude and so would fail to be God.
Worship and prayer, he insists, are appropriate responses to Logical Space. His conception of worship draws on mystical traditions. For him, worship is emotional rather than rational, a matter of seeking ecstatic union with God, of attaining a certain psychological state that has no articulable content. With respect to any rational element, he argues that Logical Space is no worse a candidate for worship than any other conception. The Logical Pantheist is free to pray, not to Logical Space, which he admits would not make sense, but to the traditional God of theism, who inhabits some regions of Logical Space (but probably not ours), in the hope that there is such a God. For the Logical Pantheist, he maintains, life inevitably has meaning, for it is up to us to steer our way through Logical Space, actualizing some regions and consigning others to mere possibility.
Few theists, I think, will be satisfied with these arguments. For the typical theist, God is not only the ground of being but also the creator, the designer, and in some sense the Telos of the world. Nothing in Logical Pantheism assigns God anything like those roles. Logical Space is not all knowing or all powerful. It is not omnibenevolent, or even benevolent at all. It is neither maker, defender, redeemer, nor friend. Logical Pantheism's conception of God remains remote from the theory or practice of most religions.
Tarski, A. (1956). Logic, Semantics, Mathematics. Oxford University Press.