The thirty-third volume of the Library of Living Philosophers is dedicated to the life and thought of Arthur Danto, the philosopher and art critic who died last October. The book is a mixed bag. This might be inevitable in a collection of twenty-seven essays and responses. But the problems go beyond the odd misfire among the contributions. The essays are at once repetitive and crucially under-inclusive; the arrangement is haphazard; and the number of essays that Danto, famous for his generosity, found impenetrable or just wrong is alarmingly high. Few will, and still fewer should, read this book cover-to-cover. The best service I can provide, then, is to highlight what parts more selective readers will not want to miss.
To start: anything written by Danto himself. The format -- and point -- of the Living Philosophers series is to put great thinkers in conversation with their critics, and Danto's short responses are almost always interesting, whether they are actually responsive or, as often, not. A reader gets more than a dozen essays deep into the book, in fact, before encountering a contribution that's better than Danto's response.
Even more rewarding is the 68-page intellectual autobiography that begins the book. Danto's narrative is breezy at times -- one page alone finds Danto, in 1950, making a movie in Rodin's foundry, getting to know Giacometti in Paris, and visiting Santayana in Rome (10). Recent survivors of the academic job market may be scandalized to hear how, in 1951, Danto was offered his first position at Columbia during an unplanned stop at its bookstore "to pick up some 3x5 cards, God knows why" (11). (He taught there for the next four decades.) Hardly less serendipitous are Danto's stories about his decision to stop producing art cold turkey in the early '60s -- before that, he was making as much money selling woodcuts as he did as an assistant professor of philosophy -- or the unexpected invitation he received in 1984 to become the art critic for The Nation, a role he inhabited to great acclaim for the next twenty-five years.
Stories like these punctuate Danto's descriptions of his own evolving philosophies of history, action, knowledge, and art -- as well as his books on Asian religions, on Nietzsche as Philosopher (what Lionel Trilling called "the snottiest title he had ever seen"), and on Sartre. (Danto's bibliography, helpfully provided at the end of the present volume, spans fifty pages.) Together, these descriptions provide as succinct and comprehensive an introduction to Danto's thought as has ever been written. I recount here the central strand of this intellectual history in part to show what the subsequent essays fail to engage, and how their arrangement muddles some of Danto's primary philosophical achievements.
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Danto's fame comes chiefly from his philosophy of art -- arguably the leading contribution to that field of the last fifty years -- and that, in turn, stemmed from a single encounter told and retold so many times in Danto's work, and in this book, that Bertrand Rougé calls it Danto's "founding myth" (281). In April 1964, Danto saw Andy Warhol's Brillo Boxes at the Stable Gallery in New York. Hand painted and made out of plywood rather than cardboard, the Brillo Boxes were otherwise near facsimiles of the boxes of Brillo pads found in the supermarket. Danto was struck by the fact that whatever difference there was between Brillo Box and an "ordinary" Brillo box could not be found by looking: that one was plywood and the other cardboard surely wasn't what made the ontological difference, after all. So why was one a work of art and the other a "mere thing"? Danto realized, to quote one of my favorite sentences of the current book, that "The task of identifying the works of art was not an ordinary recognitional skill, like identifying the giraffes in a menagerie, or the mussels in a tide pool" (44).
Instead: "To see something as art requires something the eye cannot de[s]cry -- an atmosphere of artistic theory, a knowledge of the history of art: an artworld." So Danto argued in a poorly attended talk at the APA -- Hilary Putnam was apparently speaking elsewhere at the same time (27) -- published in the Journal of Philosophy in October 1964 as "The Artworld." (Danto recounts, wonderfully, the "feeling of delicious malice" (306) with which he wrote in his "exceedingly arch essay" (26) of "Mr. Andy Warhol, the Pop artist." It is unclear what delighted him more: the fact that a philosophy journal was talking about Warhol before the popular press, or that the journal's readership would have had no idea who Danto was talking about (306-7).)
Well known as Danto's "founding myth" has become, two insights about "The Artworld" still emerge from this book. First, a full half-century after "The Artworld" was published, it is remarkable how alive the metaphor of Danto's title remains. Danto has, for years, made clear that the artworld is not a world of people or institutions, but a community of artworks, engaged in something like a conversation (429). In this book, Danto pushes that idea further, ascribing to the history of art the conversational logic (or "implicature") described by Paul Grice (456). As such, a work like Brillo Box can be said to constitute a logical next step in the "conversation" of mid-twentieth century art, but only someone following along with the conversation could hear that -- and thereby see Brillo Box as art.
In pursuing this metaphor, Danto vacillates between analogizing artworks to conversational statements (26, 456), or to the speakers themselves (428-29). The former perhaps makes more sense, but Danto's heart seems to lie with the latter. For one thing, the analogy between artworks and persons allows Danto to connect, in retrospect, the political currents of 1964, the year of the Freedom Summer and the Civil Rights Act, to his own discovery that seeing something as art requires us to look beyond appearances. The community of artworks was growing no less than the American political community, and appearances alone could no longer justify exclusion and disenfranchisement (325, 428-29). The analogy between artworks and persons, a staple of Danto's metaphysics (190, 338, 705), makes possible one of the few connections between Danto's philosophy (as opposed to his criticism or his life) and the political.
A second insight about "The Artworld" also emerges: though Danto always described himself as a systematic philosopher with interests extending far beyond the philosophy of art, he makes the stronger claim here that it was only because he had not worked in aesthetics prior to 1964 that he was able to see the philosophical value of Warhol's work (233). Prior to "The Artworld," Danto had contributed to the philosophy of history the concept of "narrative sentences," had edited with Sidney Morgenbesser an anthology on the philosophy of science, and had begun work in epistemology and the philosophy of action that would later result in books. Across these fields, Danto was looking to notions of theory-laden observation to answer philosophical problems, which, he found, all took the same form: distinguishing the perceptually indiscernible. What is the difference between raising my arm and my arm's going up, between waking life and a dream, between direct realism and phenomenalism? These were the questions Danto was grappling with at the time. Seeing Warhol's show, Danto realized immediately that the perceptual (more or less) indiscernibility of the Brillo Boxes and ordinary Brillo boxes had finally made art another proper subject of philosophy. It also showed why aesthetics -- rooted in sensuous experience -- could play no essential role in explaining the difference.
Danto's story suggests lessons beyond the autobiographical. It is striking that the giants among Danto's contemporaries -- Nelson Goodman, Richard Wollheim, and Stanley Cavell -- were all known as well or more for work in another area of philosophy as they were for their work in the philosophy of art. It is equally striking how few of the leading philosophers of art in subsequent generations can say the same -- though that may now be changing. Danto insisted that working across areas of philosophy leads to substantive differences within each area.
"The Artworld" opened the path toward Danto's future work, in part by spawning philosopher George Dickie's Institutional Theory of Art, with its far more literalized or sociological understanding of the artworld. Danto had little use for Dickie's definition of art -- their disagreement continues in this book -- but it helped him realize, he says, that a definition was needed. His attempt to formulate one led to The Transfiguration of the Commonplace (1981), Danto's greatest book.
Transfiguration could have been titled Analytical Philosophy of Art, to match Analytical Philosophy of History (1965), Analytical Philosophy of Knowledge (1968) and Analytical Philosophy of Action (1973), which preceded it. Danto tells us he rejected that title because he associated it with the Wittgensteinians and Institutionalists. But he also reveals that he wanted to write something different, even famous -- like the fictional novel within The Prime of Miss Jean Brodie, from which Danto borrowed his title (45).
In fact, though he doesn't mention this, Danto had been writing about transfiguration since "The Artworld," where he asked whether Warhol's world consisted of "latent artworks waiting, like the bread and wine of reality, to be transfigured, through some dark mystery, into the indiscernible flesh and blood of the sacrament". As that stunning sentence makes clear, what Danto was really talking about was never actually transfiguration, but transubstantiation, the Catholic mystery of the Eucharist. Only the latter takes the philosophical form Danto requires, for whereas the consecrated host and a piece of bread are classic indiscernibles, the Gospels tell us that the face of the transfigured Jesus "shone like the sun." (Robert Solomon and Kathleen Higgins gesture towards this in their essay in this volume (658).) Clear as he often was, Danto seldom let narrow exactitude mar a good line.
As if to prove this, Transfiguration spends over 200 beautifully discursive pages developing what, in the end, are just two necessary conditions for arthood: 1) artworks are about something; and 2) artworks embody their meaning. Danto freely admits that his definition is not complete -- his conditions are clearly over-inclusive (343). But they already reveal Danto's distinctive blend of essentialism and historicism, his simultaneous commitments "to the view that art is eternally the same" and "to the view that what is a work of art at one time cannot be one at another" (390). (In one of the book's unmissable essays, F. R. Ankersmit identifies the same productive tension in Danto's philosophy of history as well.) These commitments generate the three further steps taken in Danto's later work on art.
First was Danto's turn to criticism, where he was able to show, exhibit-by-exhibit, how a particular artist embodied meaning in his or her work. (Showing how embodiment works in practice largely made up for what little Danto had to say on the subject within his philosophy.) Second came Danto's theory of art history and his infamous "end of art" thesis, which held that art's developmental narrative ended once it turned its definitional project over to philosophy; the lack of stylistic imperatives in Danto's definition was well-suited to the radical pluralism that followed. Finally, there was Danto's return to beauty and the aesthetic. "The Artworld," which discussed what it means to see something as a work of art, and Transfiguration, which showed what it is to be a work of art, had both left appearances out of the account. But even if the aesthetic had no definitional role, the "aboutness" criterion in Danto's definition pointed to a non-definitional role beauty and other aesthetic properties could play: they could, in some cases, become part of an artwork's meaning. Danto thus distinguished between beauty that is internal to the work's meaning -- following Noël Carroll, he points to Brokeback Mountain as an example -- and external beauty, which is a more a property of the object than the work.
Of these various facets of Danto's engagement with art, the Living Philosophers volume has the most to say about the end of art thesis. (Danto's discussion of the Brillo Boxes in "The Artworld" generally gets subsumed within this larger theme.) The book spends less, but often more interesting, time on Danto's ontology -- though as always, the meaning criterion gets more attention than embodiment -- as well as related aspects of Danto's criticism, particularly the role he gives to artists' intentions. The contributors have nothing at all to say about Danto's theory of beauty -- an inexcusable gap. But this, finally, brings me to the problems of what is included and excluded in the present volume, and how the former is arranged.
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In his Intellectual Autobiography, Danto mentions how gratifying it was as an art critic to see his "work in print almost as soon as it was written, rather than having it languish at a journal for years before it appeared" (57). Talk about languishing: the oldest contribution in this book, George Dickie's, is dated November 1999 -- so long ago that Dickie wrote a reply to Danto's response and published it before the piece he was replying to appeared in print! Interested readers can find Dickie's reply in the "Postscript" to his essay in the second edition of Danto and His Critics, a collection of essays published in 2012. The datedness of the essays helps defeat any claim this collection might make to comprehensiveness, especially given Danto's continued productivity late in life. (Danto's last book, What Art Is, was published in 2013.)
To be fair, the book's publication was delayed so the editors could first publish their volume on Richard Rorty, then gravely ill (xxxi). But this hardly explains why there is nothing at all on beauty -- the subject of a book Danto wrote ten years ago. Understanding how the aesthetic finally entered into Danto's system helps clarify its previous absence. Too pluralistic to be anti-aesthetic, Danto's philosophy of art simply made aesthetics irrelevant. After Danto, the philosophy of art and aesthetics could no longer be treated as synonyms.
The book nods in this direction by offering separate sections under those two headings. But the choice of essays placed under those headings calls into question whether the editors understand the distinction. Why, for example, would George Dickie's attack on Danto's aboutness criterion for art -- an essay called "Art and Ontology" -- ever be placed in the "Aesthetics" section? The potential indiscernibility of artworks and mere objects is one of the few things Dickie and Danto agree about! Or conversely, why are the essays by Denis Dutton and Bertrand Rougé, two of the more interesting contributions, placed in the "Philosophy of Art" section? Dutton offers an evolutionary account of our aesthetic preferences while Rougé argues that a properly "polysensorial aesthetic experience" (283) of the Brillo Boxes would show them not to be indiscernible to their supermarket counterparts. Another of the book's highlights, Lydia Goehr's essay on the idea of "pastness" in art and in history, would make more sense in nearly any other section than it does in "Aesthetics". The essays by Susan Feagin and Ynhui Park, two of the three contributions to the "Knowing and Acting" section, have nothing discernibly to do with either knowing or acting.
In addition to the sometimes perplexing mismatch between essays and section headings, some of the section headings themselves are perplexing. I'm not sure how the first heading, "Life as Art," is meant to differ from the second, "Art as Life." Worse, I'm not sure why several of the essays in those sections were included at all. The essay by the artist Sean Scully, for example, is of great interest -- to those interested in Scully; it teaches us nearly nothing about Danto. Nor are philosophers much helped by the fourteen color plates devoted to Scully's work. (How nice it would be instead to be shown Raphael's Transfiguration, a painting to which Danto repeatedly returns (127, 164-65, 254), or Roy Lichtenstein's The Kiss -- which caused Danto, who saw a black-and-white reproduction in Artforum while on sabbatical in France, to give up his own artmaking after concluding that anything could thenceforth be art (23-25).) The book's opening essay about Danto's career as an artist fails to address what I would have thought the threshold question for inclusion in a volume such as this: what do we learn about Danto's thought by looking, in this case, at his woodcuts? The essay's author, Ewa Bogusz-Boltuc, claims that to understand Danto's notion "of a work of art as a partly conceptual thing . . . it would be beneficial to explore the relation between his artistic output and his philosophical oeuvre" (88). But if Danto is right that all works of art share the same essence, why would his own art tell us anything more about embodied meaning than any other work?
My somewhat unrelenting negativity here calls to mind what, to me, was the most interesting discussion in the first two sections: that concerning Danto's own attitude towards negative reviews. Calling himself "deeply suspicious" of negative art criticism (107), Danto suggests that it often reflects the critic's failure to get to know the artist (literally), as well as his or her work. "I am not going to . . . write a negative review unless I have gone as far as I can in getting to understand what I am looking at," Danto writes in response to artist David Reed's contribution. "Even then," Danto adds, "I would probably just not write a review in preference to a negative one."
One interesting qualification to this policy emerges in response to Gerard Vilar's essay, which offers examples of negativity in some of Danto's reviews. Danto responds, "in partial mitigation," that his reaction to the artist Bruce Nauman verged "on a kind of moral criticism" (163): Danto was offended by Nauman's aggressive imperatives -- a lithograph, for example, consisting of the words "PAY ATTENTION MOTHERFUCKERS." The work "commands us to do what we are already doing, and insults us for doing it" (163). As Danto asks: "Does being an artist give him the authority to address the viewers with degrading and humiliating language?" The ontological separation between art and mere things -- ordinary speech in this case -- was not, for Danto, a moral divide.
This qualification aside, Danto's usual generosity provides an example worth following. And in what remains of this review, I try to do exactly that, focusing on those essays that best repaid this reader's engagement.
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The strongest of the essays challenge some aspect of Danto's thought or situate it within some larger context. (This would seem too obvious to say were it not for the fact that so many of the other essays don't do either.) In the "challenging" camp are essays, already mentioned, by George Dickie, Bertrand Rougé, Noël Carroll, and the late Denis Dutton. Meanwhile, Lydia Goehr brings Danto into conversation with Adorno and, like F. R. Ankersmit, reveals the deep connections between Danto's philosophy of art and his philosophy of history. Fred Rush clarifies Danto's debts and differences from Hegel. And Crispin Sartwell, tasked with writing about sex in Danto's philosophy (720), instead turns in what is clearly a labor of love: a generous and sharp-eyed account of Danto's writing that takes note not only of its beauty and erudition, but also its longing -- as Danto puts it, the way his "writing aspires to the erotic" (720). I will say a word about each of these.
Readers looking for grounding in Danto's philosophy of art would do well to start with Rush's essay, "Danto, Hegel, and the Work of Art," which manages, in five or six startlingly concise pages, to summarize Hegel's aesthetic theory, show how Danto similarly privileges art's content, and offer an expressivist account of the embodiment prong of Danto's definition of art (459-64). Rush asks whether Danto, who thinks interpretation is constitutive of artworks, must accept that "critics have the ability to create new works every time they interpret them" (464). I recalled this discussion when reading Danto's response, which surprised me with its claim that Danto "found difficulty in recognizing [his] own views" in Rush's account of them (480). Specifically, Danto claims that he never intended his embodiment criterion to require that artworks be expressive (481). Maybe so, but there is plenty of material in the final chapter of Transfiguration to support Rush's reading.
The role of authorial intent is a recurring theme in some of the book's most useful discussions. Danto's official position is that "Whether we know what the artist meant or not, any meaning has to be historically consistent with what the artist could have meant" (47). A critic's interpretations, Danto writes in response to Gerard Vilar's essay, are like hypotheses needing to be tested; divergent interpretations mean either that "the truth has not yet been established" or that "ambiguity is internal to the work" (167). Bringing Danto's account of "narrative sentences" to bear on this question, Goehr argues that a work's meaning, though tied to the intentional act that brought it into being, might still "need time fully to unfold or to be known" (363). The resulting tension between "what an artwork is and what is claimed on its behalf" (377) is where Goehr locates much of what is politically at stake in art, for Danto as for Adorno -- though Goehr worries, rightly, that Danto downplays this productive tension insofar as he ignores the "historicity or ahistoricity of intention" (365).
Ankersmit's incredibly rich essay on representation in art and history continues this theme by noting how artists, like historical actors, see the world through representational frameworks, the existence and nature of which they cannot know (417). Cathedral builders in the thirteenth century did not know they were building Gothic cathedrals. Danto writes, somewhat disappointingly, in response to Ankersmit's piece that he "could not deal with [its] richness of detail" (432), but he wholeheartedly commends Ankersmit's "profound and searching essay" to readers, as do I.
Where Goehr and Ankersmit draw connections between Danto's philosophy of history and philosophy of art, Carroll asks whether Danto's philosophy of history is consistent with his art historical claims. Just as the cathedral builder did not know that his style was Gothic -- and the defenestrators of Prague could not have said that they were starting the Thirty Years' War -- so, too, Carroll thinks, Danto lacked the temporal distance needed to know that he was living through the End of Art -- the conclusion of art's sequence of developmental narratives. Carroll offers a competing interpretation of the end-of-art thesis as an "orientational narrative" that allowed Danto to begin practicing his pluralistic form of art criticism. Danto rejects the suggestion as biographically inaccurate (458). But here again, the historicity and (temporally-indexed) knowability of authorial intentions emerge as a problem Danto does not seem fully to engage.
Dickie puts Danto's intentionalism to different use: he claims it "destroys" Danto's thesis that artworks are necessarily about something. Continuing a decades-long disagreement, Dickie offers Malevich's Black Square and White on White as counterexamples to Danto's definition. If Malevich did not intend his paintings to be about something, Dickie claims, Danto the intentionalist would have to agree that aboutness is not a necessary condition for art. Of course, what Dickie's argument really requires is not just an intention to produce meaningless art, but a successfully realized one. And determining whether such an intention was realized by Malevich -- or has been by any other artist -- can only be done through the interpretation of individual works. Danto here as elsewhere discusses what he thinks White on White means. This is the kind of interpretive hypothesizing in which art criticism, according to Danto, always consists. If Dickie is to prove, as he concludes his sur-reply, that "Danto is wrong" about Malevich's work, he needs more than philosophical argument. He needs a better hypothesis about the work itself.
In contrast to Dickie, Rougé offers a competitor to Danto's reading of a specific artwork: Warhol's Brillo Box. Arguing that the primary work was the installation -- "art gallery as supermarket warehouse" (282) -- not the individual boxes, Rougé insists that the boxes should not be viewed as if they were readymades; they are a trompe l'oeil of readymades. Danto's too-quick turn to indiscernibility, says Rougé, is "the philosophical equivalent of Modernism's overall anti-metaphorical, anti-illusionist literalness" (292). Danto responds, confoundingly, that he was interested in "works of art indiscernible from, but not identical with, the commercial container, which ruled out thinking of them as readymades" (309). This is one of the few places in the book where Danto's response to one of his critics simply can't be right. By Danto's own lights, readymades -- the snow shovel exhibited by Duchamp, for example -- are hardly identical to their commercial counterparts, for the former but not the latter have meaning. Danto himself more-or-less equates Duchamp's work, philosophically, with the Brillo Boxes on several occasions (325, 343, 454)! Perhaps he realized the inadequacy of his response, for he led off the Acknowledgments in a 2009 book about Warhol with thanks to Rougé for the objections raised in the present book. "My current view . . . owes a great deal to having had to deal with Rougé's perception," Danto writes. This might be the only instance in the Living Philosophers volume where a contributor led Danto to reconsider the substance of one of his views.
Another opportunity for this might have come from Dutton's essay, which begins with a deep joke of a painting: Komar and Melamid's America's Most Wanted. After extensively polling people about their artistic preferences, the artists combined the winning elements into one awful painting: George Washington and three children stand on green grass near water, where deer and a hippopotamus play. For Danto the art critic, the painting has no place in the artworld, though the artists' act of polling, painting, and publicizing the results "is probably a masterpiece" (267). Dutton goes in a different direction: elements of the painting, he claims, express well-documented evolutionary preferences formed during the Pleistocene era. And this leads to a deeper suggestion: that rather than going from the philosophy of art to aesthetics, as Danto does, dividing the world into things -- including aesthetically pleasing things -- that are and are not works of art, we might instead begin with our evolutionarily and culturally produced feelings of aesthetic pleasure, dividing the world into objects that do and do not occasion such feelings. Put another way: Danto's essentialist definition picks out a set of objects, over all times and cultures, that embody meaning. But it's not clear that Danto gives us a reason to believe why that set of objects -- as opposed to, say, aesthetically pleasing things, or skillfully crafted ones -- is a set that maps onto a conceptual distinction that remains socially relevant across place and time.
In the end, this is to ask, as I wish more of the essays had, to what extent Danto got things right. Danto believed that when "philosophers get it right," philosophy reaches its end (552) -- unlike the end of art, which happens when art turns over to philosophy, in proper form, the question of its nature. A collection of this size might have provided an opportunity to take stock of what progress Danto's thought helped the philosophy of art achieve. On the other hand, as Sartwell's deeply insightful essay shows, Danto's own writing often resists "solving the problems it raised" (713). "It is beautiful authorship," Sartwell concludes, "because it makes you feel the longing of the author, and his resolution to remain in or savor that longing rather than, say, to try to satisfy it immediately" (713).
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Before closing, I have to acknowledge the poignancy one feels reading this book at a time when the series' title, the Library of Living Philosophers, is no longer apt. My throat caught when I reached Danto's gorgeous description of Fra Angelico's Last Judgment, where the blessed are shown "leaving behind a world of beauty for something Fra Angelico does not show and perhaps cannot show" (251). "There is something pathetic in the poverty of human imagination," Danto writes, "in its effort to think up something sufficiently engaging that it would be worth leaving this marvelous place -- the common place -- to dwell in instead" (250).
Early in his autobiography, Danto notes that most philosophers enter the field because of "an inspired teacher" or a piece of writing that "opens their eyes to an undreamt of set of ideas" (7). For me, that writing was Danto's. Reading "The Artworld" for the first time, in a college stairwell while waiting for a professor's office hours, set the course for the next decade of my life. I don't know what struck me more: the unrelenting outpouring of ideas, references, and examples, or the language in which they were embodied. I had never read anything like that essay, and -- outside of Danto's own writing -- haven't since.
I am told that this book finally made it to Danto not long before his death, and that, like so many other things in this world, it pleased him greatly. I suspect that to some extent it was the very fact of the book rather than its content that gave Danto such pleasure. And yet the best of the essays, Danto's own writing, and, perhaps especially, the manner in which Danto engages with all involved, really do memorialize his life's work. To borrow one of the many images Danto left us:
We can imagine a boy very attached to a certain white marble going into a profound melancholia until his mother finds a white marble that does not so much replace the other as memorialize it: it stands in a special showcase, like a relic, and reminds him of his lost treasure (it could be the very marble he lost).
 Arthur Danto, "The Artworld," Journal of Philosophy 61, no. 19 (October 15, 1964), 580.
 Ibid. 580-81.
 Mark Rollins, ed., Danto and His Critics, 2d ed. (Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2012), 116-17.
 Ibid., 117.
 Arthur C. Danto, Andy Warhol (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2009), xvii.
 Arthur C. Danto, The Transfiguration of the Commonplace (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1981), 80.