2019.07.24

Robert C. Scharff

Heidegger Becoming Phenomenological: Interpreting Husserl Through Dilthey, 1916-1925

Robert C. Scharff, Heidegger Becoming Phenomenological: Interpreting Husserl Through Dilthey, 1916-1925, Rowman and Littlefield, 2019, 186pp., $39.95 (pbk) ISBN 9781786607737

Reviewed by Leslie MacAvoy, East Tennessee State University


In this book Robert C. Scharff argues that Heidegger's path to phenomenology owes more to his reading of Dilthey than it does to Husserl. The book is detailed, well-researched, and argued in a refreshingly direct style. It is important reading for anyone interested in Heidegger's early work, and should motivate many to give more consideration to Dilthey's influence on Heidegger. The argument is complicated, so in what follows I will make some general observations about how the position is situated relative to other broad positions in the discourse and then articulate the main line of argument through the book while also offering a few critical observations.

Like many other readers of Heidegger, Scharff emphasizes his critique of Husserl. However, unlike those who go on to argue that Heidegger's philosophy should be understood as modifying and building upon Husserl's phenomenology, Scharff maintains that if Heidegger viewed Husserl's phenomenology as in need of critique, then he must have already had an idea of what phenomenology ought to do, and this he learned from Dilthey. To make this argument, he draws on Heidegger's writings on Dilthey from 1916-1925, but focuses primarily on the early Freiburg lectures (1919-1923). Although some Heidegger scholars minimize the importance of these lectures, Scharff argues for their significance as indicators of what Heidegger was reading and thinking about as he developed his own phenomenology. I think he is right that these texts should not be dismissed, as they provide important clues to how Heidegger's thinking develops in the intellectual, philosophical context of the early 20th century and the various debates that dominated the philosophical scene at the time. And certainly these texts have received a lot of attention by Heidegger scholars who are interested in Heidegger's 'hermeneutics of facticity'. While Scharff's reading bears some affinities with this work, he seems to distance himself from at least some of that literature as well, insofar as he insists that it isn't a question of choosing between phenomenology and hermeneutics or between Husserl and Dilthey (xvi), but is rather a question of showing that Heidegger develops his own approach to phenomenology by incorporating insights from hermeneutics learned by reading Dilthey, and that this appropriation informs his critique of Husserl.

Scharff similarly positions himself against Heidegger scholarship that searches for the origins of Being and Time in these early lecture courses by retrospectively reading Heidegger's later concern with being back into them. He urges that we resist this temptation. If we take these texts on their own terms, we find that the basic question that guides Heidegger's thinking during this period is not the question of being or of the meaning of being, but instead the question of how to become a phenomenologist or to do phenomenology. Scharff's interpretation follows this question. It should also be noted that this stance of taking the lectures on their own terms and reading them in their historical-factical context is important for Scharff's own hermeneutic thesis and is manifest throughout the book. It is emphasized not only in how he reads Heidegger, but in how he sees Heidegger reading both Dilthey and Husserl. Heidegger, he argues, subjects the work of both thinkers to a destructive retrieval. On Scharff's recounting, Heidegger finds more to retrieve in Dilthey and more to destroy in Husserl, so the emphasis differs, but in each case it is a question not just of critiquing these philosophers "from the outside" but of interpreting them in such a way that the positive contribution that each makes can be articulated more fully and carried further. Husserl wants to focus on lived experience, but his 'technique-based' phenomenological methodology gets in the way. Dilthey, on the other hand, whose stated goals are quite different, provides Heidegger with an alternative view of how to articulate experience.

Part I focuses primarily on the retrieval of Dilthey. The first point is to establish that Dilthey is concerned with more than the "Erklären-Verstehen debate," in which the central issue is the epistemological approach of the human sciences, how it does or should differ from that of the natural sciences, and whether it really counts as scientific. Athough Dilthey thought of himself as an epistemologist of the human sciences and therefore is usually read in these terms, Scharff argues that his real hermeneutic insight is to see that the natural sciences and the human sciences both emerge from a 'standpoint of life'. In other words, both are practices that stem from historical life trying to make sense of itself and the world, and therefore reflect and express the concerns of the lifeworld in which they are rooted. The importance of this is twofold. First, it highlights the fact that the natural sciences are not neutral and presuppositionless, but are just as embedded in the lifeworld as any other human practice or inquiry. Second, it points to the idea that human life itself involves an interpretive tendency such that we, as humans, are engaged in an ongoing historical process of self-interpretation, which is expressed and manifested in multiple practices that reflect concrete factical concerns. These ideas will sound familiar to readers who know Heidegger's later position in Being and Time, and the suggestion is that the seed from which Heidegger's later view grows is to be found here in Dilthey.

While these points are important for Heidegger, Scharff particularly wants to emphasize his retrieval of Dilthey's idea of the standpoint of life as the perspective from which to do phenomenology. The argument is made by considering Heidegger's critique of Husserl's critique of Dilthey's historicism in "Philosophy as Rigorous Science"[1] (hereafter, PRS). In that essay, Husserl argues for the transcendental phenomenological attitude as the position from which to develop a rigorously scientific philosophy, and argues that this attitude is not available within either naturalistic philosophy or Weltanschauung philosophy. In discussing the latter, Husserl objects to Dilthey's position as a historicism that leads to relativism, and thus rejects the standpoint of life in favor of the phenomenological attitude. Scharff turns to Heidegger's discussion of this critique in Basic Problems of Phenomenology (GA 58)[2] and Introduction to Phenomenological Research (GA 17)[3] to show that he disagrees with this assessment. In GA 58 in particular, Heidegger holds that the standpoint of life is a better position from which to access lived experience and therefore is the proper stance from which to do phenomenology. On Scharff's reading, Heidegger's familiarity with the Dilthey-Yorck correspondence allows him to see more potential in Dilthey's standpoint of life (60-66). Heidegger appreciates Yorck's friendly amendments to and observations about Dilthey's position, particularly the idea of "broaden[ing] the scope of Dilthey's return to Erlebnis so that it encompasses the whole of human life and not just the sciences" (66). Furthermore, reading Dilthey through Yorck allows Heidegger to see that experience should be conceived as something lived-through and not just reflected upon (66).

These insights about the standpoint of life and experience as lived-through are important retrievals from Dilthey, or at least from Yorck's reading of Dilthey, and inform Heidegger's critique of Husserl. Part II aims to show how this is the case. Again, Heidegger's critical discussion of Husserl's position as presented in PRS figures prominently in Scharff's discussion. In that essay the phenomenological attitude is presented in strongly transcendental terms, and Scharff's discussion of the objections to this position covers familiar terrain. Husserl's position is too Cartesian; it places too much emphasis on the theoretical attitude; the method involves a phenomenological reduction that brackets the world. But central to Scharff's account of what is wrong with Husserl's position from Heidegger's point of view is that the method is essentially one of reflection (Reflexion) (120).

This point of emphasis is interesting for two reasons. First, on Scharff's reading, Husserl's commitment to reflection is what motivates the reduction, which in turn introduces the theoretical attitude and the Cartesian subject-object relation that is so widely critiqued. Reflection amounts to a distancing procedure that turns the phenomenological attitude into one that involves stepping out of life or putting it at a distance (103). Thus, reflection is the core idea from which these other objectionable features emerge. Second, Husserl's notion of reflection contrasts in an interesting way with a different notion of reflection that has its origin in Dilthey. Scharff shows that in GA 58 Heidegger argues for a phenomenological standpoint that is somehow capable of reflecting upon life without becoming distanced from it. This entails the cultivation of a sympathy with life that is achieved in living through it (103). Scharff argues that Heidegger is building on Dilthey here, and while the picture is somewhat sketchy, the suggestion is that Dilthey's concept of 'inward awareness' offers an alternative model of reflection (130). In this type of awareness a content is presented "without differentiation," meaning that there is no split between subject and object and therefore no distancing, no introduction of a theoretical attitude or Cartesian stance (131). Instead the content is illuminated, highlighted, or intensified by the awareness. Scharff thinks this awareness is what Heidegger is referring to in GA 58 when he talks about an immediate participation in experience that contrasts with the non-participation that is required by Husserl's reduction (131).[4] This idea of an alternate kind of reflection or awareness is certainly suggestive but not much developed, and in view of its importance in the overall argument, further discussion would have been a welcome addition to the text.

Finally, there is the question of whether phenomenology as Husserl conceives of it really counts as rigorous science. Scharff, following Heidegger, argues that Husserl's ideal of rigor is drawn from a scientific ideal that emphasizes certainty and exactness, which is not a neutral ideal at all but is the manifestation of a particular concern within life that applies to a particular domain (112). Moreover, Husserl's position reflects the idea that to think rigorously at all is to think in terms of this model of scientific rigor. Not only does this grant the exact sciences a monopoly on rigor from the beginning, it means that the only objects that can be phenomenologically disclosed through this method are scientific objects (114). Thus, this method forecloses the possibility of disclosing a broader range of objects in terms that are appropriate to them. From Heidegger's point of view, then, true rigor requires abandoning Husserl's version of the phenomenological standpoint and taking up the 'standpoint of life' from within which things can be disclosed to us in experience more broadly. Scharff claims that Heidegger holds that phenomenology begins when we notice the fullness of life as it is lived through and cultivate the "experience of the experiencing of it" (117). This signals a shift from what he calls a technique-based phenomenology, which emphasizes methods like the reduction, to an 'experience-based' phenomenology that requires cultivating a closeness or sympathy with life (118). Unlike the 'bracketing' of life that Husserl emphasizes, this would entail a 'rejoining' (118). It seems, however, that there is no method for cultivating this awareness (104, 119-120), and we are left with what Scharff calls at one point a 'no-method construal' of phenomenology (141, n. 10). While this might seem somewhat unsatisfying, the point must be that to decide on a method in advance not only assumes a 'one size fits all' approach to method, but is unphenomenological.

Scharff makes a good case for the importance of Dilthey (or of Yorck's reading of Dilthey) to the development of Heidegger's thought, and he does so in a way that is novel, namely by focusing on how the reading of Dilthey shapes the perspective from which Heidegger critiques Husserl. However, the discussion of that critique is very narrowly circumscribed to Heidegger's comments on PRS and then mainly his comments on this text in the early Freiburg lectures, principally GA 58. This is odd because not only does Heidegger discuss Husserl's philosophy in more places during the 1916-1925 period, but he discusses PRS at much greater length in GA 17, which receives comparatively little attention in Scharff's account. In fact the date range in the book's title, 1916-1925, creates expectations for the texts that should fall within the scope of the discussion that aren't borne out. This leads to some confusion. Ultimately it seems that Scharff is principally interested in the texts where Heidegger discusses Dilthey or elaborates ideas that show his influence rather than those where Heidegger discusses Husserl. The Dilthey influence is more pronounced in the early Freiburg lectures, including GA 58 where Heidegger talks about the standpoint of life, and in GA 17 he no longer uses that language.

In the end these considerations may be beside the point for the sort of philosophical and hermeneutical task that Scharff has undertaken. His concern with hermeneutics is not only to show that Heidegger is a hermeneutic phenomenologist, but to point out that there are different ways to read a text. One option is to take an external, observational perspective that focuses on what the text is about, analyzing its claims, or comparing them with claims made in another text (xviii, 5, 56). A great deal of philosophical scholarship, including Heidegger scholarship, is done from this perspective. A second option, the one Scharff emphasizes, involves interpreting a text by situating it within its factical-historical horizon, understanding it as an expression of life and lived experience, and coming to understand it in its own terms. In other words, to understand the text, one has to understand where it is coming from. Scharff argues that Heidegger adopts this hermeneutic approach in reading both Dilthey and Husserl -- that he tries to understand what they are trying to do philosophically, even if the language they use or the concepts they have inherited fail them, and to go forward from there. This is why his approach is a destructive retrieval and not just a destruction. Scharff doesn't just describe this approach in discussing Heidegger; he also enacts it. His book performs the kind of hermeneutic effort for which it advocates. Heidegger Becoming Phenomenological does make an important contribution to Heidegger scholarship, but that is not its only goal. It also aims to retrieve from Heidegger the idea of doing philosophy that emerges from experience and responds to the concerns of the surrounding lifeworld.


[1] Edmund Husserl, "Philosophy as Rigorous Science," trans. Quentin Lauer, in Husserl: Shorter Works, ed. Peter McCormick and Frederick A. Elliston (Notre Dame, IN: Notre Dame University Press, 1981), 166-197.

[2] Martin Heidegger, Grundprobleme der Phänomenologie (1919-1920), GA 58, hsg. Hans-Helmuth Gander (Frankfurt: Vittorio Klostermann, 1993); Basic Problems of Phenomenology, Winter Semester 1919/1920, trans. Scott M. Campbell (New York: Bloomsbury Press, 2013).

[3] Martin Heidegger, Einführung in die phänomenologische Forschung (1923-1924), GA 17, hsg. Friedrich-Wilhelm von Herrmann (Frankfurt: Vittorio Klostermann, 1994); Introduction to Phenomenological Research, trans. Daniel O. Dahlstrom (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 2005).

[4] See GA 58 254/191-92.