2019.10.02

Markus Weidler

Heidegger's Style: On Philosophical Anthropology and Aesthetics

Markus Weidler, Heidegger's Style: On Philosophical Anthropology and Aesthetics, Bloomsbury, 2018, 269pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350083394.

Reviewed by Krzysztof Ziarek, University at Buffalo


Limiting himself to a select number of texts, Markus Weidler sets out in this book to examine two aspects of Heidegger's work: the critique of philosophical anthropology and aesthetics, or more precisely, the working of art, and to do so against the backdrop of the historical context, reaching back to the end of the 18th century. The lynchpin connecting those two parts is his claim about the crucial role of Heidegger's "style," though what Weidler means by "style" would perhaps be more adequately described as a number of rhetorical moves characteristic of Heidegger's stylistic ingenuity in the texts under discussion. Weidler's thesis concerns Heidegger's unique way of "crafting a novel genre of philosophical writing. Such writing is placed in the service of an alternative mode of inquiry, which may be dubbed artisan thinking" (p. 1). According to Weidler, Heidegger pairs that manner of thinking with an interventionist style aimed at subverting the neo-Kantian philosophical thought dominant at the time that Heidegger began teaching and publishing. He sometimes calls such rhetorical gestures Heidegger's "hook" (p. 137). This term as used by Weidler, given the historical and philosophical contexts it invokes, conjures up predominantly negative connotations, implying that Heidegger baits his readers with high flying rhetoric (using phrases such as "the holy", "epochal occurrences or changes", and "event of revelation"). He does so without fully delivering the goods, so to speak, as Weidler tries to show lapses or holes in Heidegger's argument. Since Weidler adopts such an approach, it needs to be said from the start that he himself employs rhetorical hooks to amplify his critique. The obvious cases, which I will discuss near the end of the review, include his use of the phrase "Prussian resolve" in the title of the final chapter and his mention of "fanaticism" in the conclusion. Such loaded terms, with their negative connotations, reflect the tone of Weidler's commentary. One could argue that they too "stylistically" bait the reader, and color, if not pre-judge, the issues he discusses.

Weidler focuses on Heidegger's works from the decade spanning 1936-1946, singling out texts on Schelling and "The Origin of the Work of Art," through texts on Hegel and Nietzsche, to "Letter on Humanism." It is in these texts, Weidler proposes, that the outlines of Heidegger's "artisanal thinking" emerge. Weidler does not limit himself to this decade; his last chapter focuses on death and "resolve" (Entschlossenheit) in Being and Time (1927). Part One comprises three chapters dedicated respectively to philosophical anthropology in the first Schelling lecture, revelation in the second Schelling lecture, and "The Origin of the Work of Art." These chapters constitute the most interesting contribution offered by this study, as they explore aspects of Heidegger's critique of philosophical anthropology, in particular his remarks on Scheler and Simmel, in the broader historical context of the "anthropological revolution of the 1780s" (p. 11). Weidler focuses on moments where he sees Heidegger not giving enough consideration in his discussion of Schelling to the way in which ideas from Herder and Schiller operate in the background of Heidegger's analysis. He also takes issue with Heidegger's critical remarks on Scheler and Simmel; his discussion of Simmel in this regard is particularly interesting. The third chapter explores two aspects of "The Origin of the Work of Art": the notion of the figure (Gestalt) and the idea of language. The discussion of Gestalt (p. 73) is particularly illuminating, explaining the dynamic, unsettled character of Gestalt, which merges aspects of form and matter, and thus undermines received aesthetic categories. It is a pity that Weidler does not examine in more detail the implications of Heidegger's use of Gestalt in this context since they precisely call into question aesthetic approaches to art. Weidler instead opts, via Schiller, to reclaim egalitarian aesthetic experience (p. 79) as the counter to what he implicitly criticizes as Heidegger's non-communicative, "preprophetic" discourse (p. 79).

Part Two looks at the links between aesthetics and critique of subjectivity in the Nietzsche lectures and the Hegel and Nietzsche texts in Holzwege. Theological issues, Christian spirituality, and anthropological philosophy remain as references through this discussion. Part Three takes up the question of poetry in "Why Poets?" and the critique of humanism and the role of Hölderlin's poetry in "Letter on Humanism." The book ends with a curious CODA devoted to death and resolve in Being and Time, which predates by nearly a decade the other works Weidler discusses. If the first three chapters of the book are arguably its best, then the two chapters in Part III, together with the CODA and the Conclusion, are the most problematic and easy to contest. The CODA challenges Ian Thompson's reading of death in Being and Time in the context of German culture's glorification of death during the epoch, without engaging at all the extensive list of interpretations of being-toward-death extant in Continental philosophy. While it is not possible to examine the details of Weidler's analysis, let me mention the following. Heidegger's analysis in Being and Time and elsewhere, for instance, in The Event (1942) from the decade Weidler focuses on, zeroes in not on death per se but on "being-toward-death" as the opening onto the experience of the temporality of existence. In other words, it is not about death as the end of life, but refers instead to what in "The Thing" Heidegger describes as "dying" which transpires -- as the rise and turning into nothing of each moment -- only as long as one remains alive. In this sense, "being-toward-death" is eminently about existing and has little to do with heroism or sacrifice. A careful reading of Being and Time leaves no doubt about this.

Even more dubious is the claim that Entschlossenheit evokes "Prussian resolve," a claim that flattens Heidegger's phenomenological inquiry beyond recognition. It misses a key stylistic feature of Heidegger, namely, his penchant for turning terms inside out by playing on and highlighting (through hyphenation) German prefixes. While Entschlossenheit indeed means resolve and determinateness (and thus can be linked to decisionism), Heidegger amplifies two senses of the prefix ent. On the one hand, it gives the sense of additional definiteness to the closure or decisiveness indicated by the verb schliessen, yet on the other, it undoes this very closure, ironically turning Entschlossenheit into its apparent opposite: a continual holding open. While Weidler does analyze some instances in which Heidegger plays opposites against each other, he does not look at the crucial way in which Heidegger repeatedly institutes such turns within single terms. In the case under discussion, the double play of the prefix ent- indicates the direction in which Heidegger's thinking moves: the noun seemingly indicative of steady resolve, in fact, as Heidegger's analysis clearly substantiates and generations of scholars point out, subverts Entschlossenheit so that it no longer functions in its conventional German sense and names not decisionism but instead what Will McNeill aptly renders as "resolute openness." The core of Heidegger's analysis demonstrates that to be in its own mode of being as Dasein, Dasein needs to stay resolutely open to what comes its way, open to resituating itself, and to questioning the decisions it nonetheless needs to make. Through this maneuver, Entschlossenheit, particularly when written with a hyphen, comes to indicate the impossibility of closure, characteristic of being-toward-death. That this double play is indeed the case is manifested also by other terms in Heidegger, beginning with Entfernung in Being and Time, which in the same gesture means both deepening of distance and de-distancing) or Entsprechen, which suggests both a correspondence and the undoing of the speaking in the act of co(r)responding to it.

The only way to follow along the trajectory of Heidegger's thinking is to stay mindful of the tensions and inversions he creates within words by opening them up through hyphens and the multiple resonances of German prefixes. This is in fact the hallmark of more broadly conceived "style" of Heidegger's thinking, one that reaches beyond rhetorical gestures and ploys or reversals of opposites into the very core of words, as it were. This style is developed precisely in the decade inaugurated with the 1936-38 Contributions to Philosophy, and evolving through the so-called Ereignis-manuscripts, which Weidler does not discuss, even though they run in parallel to the texts he focuses on.

This context highlights the problematic status of the phrase "Prussian resolve" and the artificially imposed "conceptual persona" of Captain Klein, which Weidler proposes "as symptomatic of the ideological underpinnings of German military culture at the time. By the same token [he submits] this myth is exemplary of Heidegger's promotion of empty resolve devoid of content" (p. 181). If anything, Heidegger's Entschlossenheit undercuts such resolve, resolve which, and Weidler's conclusion overstates this, comes close to the fanaticism he associates with the Prussian tradition (p. 203). Would not the "conceptual persona" of a German soldier with Hölderlin's hymns in his knapsack, a persona that actually appears in "The Origin of the Work of Art," be more appropriate as well as less artificial and ideologically tinged in this context?

What complicates matters is that Weidler not only limits his discussion to select texts of Heidegger from the decade 1936-1946 but also that his use of scholarship about Heidegger is curiously limited to a few texts that come largely from the analytic tradition. A very extensive Continental literature pertinent to the question of philosophical anthropology and the critique of the subject, on the one hand, and to aesthetics, poetry, and the work of art, on the other (for instance, the extensive literature on Heidegger's Hölderlin) is neither mentioned in the book nor included in the bibliography. Such very limited engagement with Heidegger scholarship is not necessarily problematic, but in this case a careful consideration of other approaches to Heidegger on language, art, and poetry could have perhaps led Weidler to broaden his scope, revise some of his quick judgments, and ultimately add nuance to and deepen parts of the study. This is the case, in particular, regarding the role of Heidegger's critique of philosophical anthropology (and anthropocentrism in particular), as well as Heidegger's idiomatic approach to language (extensive arguments and elaborations of language on Heidegger, from earlier works by Kockelmans or Bernasconi to more recent Heidegger and Language or Language After Heidegger, to name only a few, are not considered). As a result, Weidler's book does not really elucidate or engage with what is at stake in Heidegger's critique of anthropocentrism or its potential relevance today.

In a similar vein, the book does not look at the crucial import of Heidegger's thought on language and art for subsequent critiques of aesthetics. Finally, the notion of style is presented rather narrowly. In fact, "Heidegger's style" encompasses several other crucial issues and practices in Heidegger's texts, which the book never discusses. For instance, it does not consider existing work on Heidegger on style, e.g., the collection of essays explicitly devoted to this issue, Die Stile Martin Heideggers (Alber, 2013), not to mention numerous books and essays devoted to Heidegger's language. Most importantly, Weidler does not take into serious consideration Heidegger's own texts on language or his way of reshaping or re-inventing/reinvigorating the German vocabulary, whether in On the Way to Language or in the recently published volumes GA 71, The Event or GA 74, both works dating from the very decade on which Weidler focuses. These texts by Heidegger provide ample explanation of his notion of the word, and elaborate on the ways in which he adapts the term Sage, showing that "Language" with the capital "L" or some mysterious or mythical narrative is not at issue, as Weidler suggests, but the complex turn of language that, as event, has always already arrived into words.[1] Since the publication of the manuscripts devoted to the event (Ereignis), dating from 1936 to 1944 and noted for their unique "experimental" approach to language, any discussion of Heidegger's style of writing that does not take those manuscripts into account will remain limited from the start. Ultimately, these decisions and the very selective engagement with long standing debates in Heidegger studies prevent the book from being richer and more judicious and circumspect in the exposition of its three central concerns: philosophical anthropology, the work of art, and the style of philosophical presentation.

REFERENCES

Baur, P., Bösel B., Mersch, D., eds. 2013. Die Stile Martin Heideggers. Alber Verlag.

Bernasconi, R. 1985. The Question of Language in Heidegger's History of Being. Humanities Press.

Heidegger, M. 2013. The Event. Indiana University Press.

Heidegger, M. 2010. Zum Wesen der Sprache und Zur Frage nach der Kunst. Gesamtausgabe 74. Vittorio Klostermann Verlag.

Kockelmans, J. J. 1972. On Heidegger and Language. Northwestern University Press.

Powell, J., ed. 2013. Heidegger and Language. Indiana University Press.

Ziarek, K. 2013. Language After Heidegger. Indiana University Press.


[1] For a very different approach to Heidegger's style, its intricacies and layers, his expropriation of words, see Krzysztof Ziarek, K. Language After Heidegger.