2020.05.06

Colin Koopman

How We Became Our Data: A Genealogy of the Informational Person

Colin Koopman, How We Became Our Data: A Genealogy of the Informational Person, University of Chicago Press, 2019, 269pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780226626581.

Reviewed by Ladelle McWhorter, University of Richmond


Colin Koopman's title encapsulates the central -- and both disturbing and compelling -- arguments of his book: (1) over the past century, a new sort of subject has emerged, whom he dubs the informational person; (2) this new subject formed within an initially disparate array of administrative and technical practices of data collection, formatting, storage, and application; and (3) this subject is us. The third claim bears emphasizing; Koopman writes, "Our data do not simply point at who we already were before information systems were constructed. Rather, our information composes significant parts of our very selves. Data are active participants in our making. The formats structuring data help shape who we are" (vii). Our informational selves are not merely doubles of our real selves, as Bernard Harcourt has suggested; they are our real selves (170), even if we exceed them in some important ways.

Koopman's work is obviously informed by that of Michel Foucault, who provided us with genealogical accounts of such subjectivities as delinquents, homosexuals, and normal(ized), deviant, and dangerous individuals, all formed within operations of power networks and bureaucratic and technical practices during the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. Who we are, Foucault has shown, depends upon the forces that delineate and specify subject positions and prescribe the various practices of selfhood that we are encouraged and sometimes required to incorporate and embody. Koopman's informational person is more ubiquitous than these others, however. While only some are criminals or perverts, all of us now are informational persons. No one is not data, even, he asserts, members of communities in remote regions known only to each other and a few anthropologists (9). We are population and census data, certainly, but more intimately, we are our vital statistics, our credit reports, our personality inventories, our insurance policies, our educational records, our fitbit badges, our Facebook and dating app profiles. We are not only captured and stored in databases; we understand our daily lives and personal experiences in data formats and sets and, likewise, we thus understand our colleagues and loved ones.

The three chapters of Part I, "Histories of Information Inputs," offer narratives of the development of data collection and storage, formatting, processing, and application or "output" over the years 1913 to 1937, the decades prior to the rise of information theory. Koopman argues that theory followed practices, contrary to thinkers such as Donna Haraway who look to World War II and its aftermath for the beginnings of digital and digitized humanity (15). People had already begun to experience themselves as information before the war, he asserts, which explains why information and communication theories captured so many fertile imaginations so quickly in the post-war period. People were attempting to understand and articulate what they had already begun to experience and become.

Koopman investigates three sets of practices: birth certification (beginning in 1913), personality testing (beginning in 1917), and "scientific" real estate appraisal (beginning in 1923). These three conveniently illustrate the three phases of information systems analysis: input, processing, and output (IPO), actually showing how the technical problems associated with each phase were encountered and solved. The chapter on birth certification explores how government agencies intent upon promoting child welfare tackled the problems of standardizing formats for data collection, filing data -- including the physical size of each certificate and projected shelf space necessary for storage facilities over time -- and conducting audits to determine whether collection methods were successful. The chapter on personality testing focuses on how data came to be defined and made "processable," oddly enough regardless of whether it was connected in any clear way with material reality. Personality was a new concept during this period. Through the work of psychologists such as Gordon Allport, personality came to be defined as a finite collection of measurable traits (86), which could be processed as data through algorithms designed to yield the dynamic organization of each person's unique adjustment over time to his or her environment (95). Personality testing is a remarkable formatting achievement whose developmental history gives a fascinating and disturbing picture of how informational persons were and are generated algorithmically. More than our birth certificates or our credit scores, we surely are our personalities. And yet, as Koopman's chapter demonstrates, our personalities are also artifacts of information technology at least as much as they are the truths of ourselves; they are both, simultaneously, and this chapter drives that point home.

A reader might be forgiven for dreading the chapter on real estate appraisal, but it actually intensifies the drama that the chapter on personality testing staged. Here Koopman shows very clearly how race and racism became embedded -- and ultimately hidden -- in algorithms, producing racist effects long after racism was officially disavowed in real estate appraisal and sales, mortgage lending, and city planning. Appraisal was made into a science, and race in relation to property value became a fact within that science. The results were racial segregation in housing -- and therefore also education and social and commercial services -- and severe limits on the ability of African Americans to build wealth by purchasing homes, which of course is one big factor in the current wealth gap between African Americans and whites in the US. This chapter shows how once processing became "scientific" and thus morally and politically "neutral," racist outputs were made inevitable, automatic, and "nobody's fault." The informational person just is a racialized person who exists in an inevitably racist social, legal, political, and economic system.

Koopman's genealogical work in Part I is fascinating and persuasive in and of itself, but readers of Foucault in particular will have questions that chapter four is designed to address. A central claim of the book is that info-power is a new modality of power unlike anything prior. Yet many readers will be accustomed to thinking of state practices such as gathering, compiling, and analyzing vital statistics as prominent practices of biopower. And, of course, we are prone to understand intelligence and personality testing as tools of normalization and disciplinary power. As an accomplished Foucault scholar himself, Koopman is alert to his readers' likely confusion, if not outright skepticism on this point, and goes into impressive depth to answer it.

Koopman argues that info-power simply cannot be reduced to sovereign power, disciplinary power, or biopower. (Koopman, like a number of other commentators, reserves the term biopower for population management and its techniques of security, while others see population management and security techniques as one component of biopower along with normalizing disciplinary power. Here I follow Koopman's categorization.) He begins by distinguishing info-power from biopower, noting that info-power is not concerned with populations as living entities nor is it necessarily interested in regulating such populations; it is not about life but about accounting (164). Nor is info-power like disciplinary power; it does not normalize and does not operate on individual bodies. Info-power does not identify individuals by their developmental trajectories but rather by their traits (165). Finally, info-power is not sovereign or deductive power; it neither prohibits actions nor extracts goods or tribute. Unformatted people are not so much punished as they are rendered invisible; they are simply excluded from recognition and, therefore, suffer the hardships that lack of documentation brings (167). Info-power is not incompatible with the exercise of other forms of power; in some instances, it clearly can reinforce biopower and techniques of security, for example, as well as deductive power and legalized prohibition. It is hard to imagine contemporary public policy or law enforcement agencies operating without extensive databases of individuals' personal information, including personality traits. These irreducible modes of power, Koopman argues, layer upon one another (171), with info-power at first perhaps infiltrating the others' operations as mere instrument but eventually transforming some of the operations of those other modes of power as it itself adapted to aspects of their regimes (172).

Koopman argues, further, that describing a mode of power that Foucault did not describe is not a departure from the practice of Foucaultian genealogy. Genealogy, he maintains, is a method, which must be distinguished from the particular concepts developed for use within any particular genealogical investigation (20). That method entails three philosophical commitments: (1) It is a practice of critique. It does not stand in judgment or say what is wrong with the world, but it explores the limits of what we can do in the present. It is concerned with the conditions of possibility that define the present and make certain actions impossible for us. (2) It is concerned with these conditions of possibility insofar as they are contingent rather than necessary. In other words, it presumes change through time. It therefore requires involvement with history. "History without philosophy would not know where to look -- and philosophy without history would have nothing to see" (20). And (3) it is committed to complexity (21). It does not look for single causes. Conditions are compromises of struggles. Koopman adheres to these methodological commitments religiously even while developing concepts such as info-power and the informational person that differ markedly from some of the concepts so prominent in Foucault's genealogical works.

Koopman devotes much of chapter 5 to showing that the communicative political theories of J├╝rgen Habermas and others cannot appreciate or take account of the politics of information. Communicative theories of democracy presuppose information already gathered and processed -- already formatted -- and so cannot raise questions about the political status of that information and the formatting procedures from which it emerges (187). As a result, they will forever be trapped in deliberative processes that cannot get at the networks of power relations that structure deliberative institutions and practices. I will leave it to scholars of deliberative democratic theory to appraise Koopman's arguments thoroughly; suffice it to say that chapter 5 deserves very careful attention for its bold and negative assessment of the limits of deliberative democracy.

I conclude this review with a word of praise for the clarity of Koopman's prose style and remarkable ability to organize complex material into a concise yet detailed presentation. The book is extremely readable, so much so that any undergraduate can grasp its main points and digest its evidence. The book is essential for those of us who practice genealogy and those of us who study Foucault's work, but it should be very useful for less specialized readers. It provides a timely and very important perspective on contemporary society, one that may become especially significant as we develop the tracking tools necessary to stem the current coronavirus pandemic. Koopman has my gratitude for this important piece of work.