Katrina Forrester

In the Shadow of Justice: Postwar Liberalism and the Remaking of Political Philosophy

Katrina Forrester, In the Shadow of Justice: Postwar Liberalism and the Remaking of Political Philosophy, Princeton University Press, 2019, 401pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691163086.

Reviewed by Samuel Freeman, University of Pennsylvania


Katrina Forrester's book is an engaging history of John Rawls's intellectual development and the outpouring of work in political philosophy his ideas have engendered. She focuses on the evolution of Rawls's theory of justice and the historical conditions from which it purportedly grew in the late 1940s and early 1950s. She discusses the responses of Rawls's notable critics and reviews alternative positions by significant philosophers and political theorists of the era. These include Brian Barry, Charles Beitz, G.A. Cohen, Ronald Dworkin, Robert Goodin, H.L.A. Hart, Thomas Nagel, Robert Nozick, Susan Okin, Onora O'Neill, Derek Parfit, T.M. Scanlon, Amartya Sen, Peter Singer, Judith Shklar, Charles Taylor, Judith Thomson, Michael Walzer, Bernard Williams, and other leading figures. Forrester concisely summarizes their core ideas and discusses how their work responds to or is critical of the left-liberal position Rawls advocated, liberal egalitarianism. The book provides a significant summary, with few distortions, of the philosophers' ideas it reviews, and is a notable contribution to the history of ideas.

The development and critical response to liberal egalitarian theories of justice has been a central concern within political philosophy since Rawls's Theory of Justice. This is the "shadow of justice" Forrester invokes in her book's title. Her primary thesis is that for the past fifty years, Rawls and the liberal egalitarianism he inspired have defined the intellectual environment of political philosophy, coloring the work of political philosophers of all persuasions. Rawls's shadow also defines the terms of engagement that must be adhered to by political theorists who reject justice as the proper place to begin, or even end, discussions in political philosophy and theory. "The Rawlsian framework came to act as a constraint on what kind of theorizing could be done and what kind of politics could be imagined." (p. 275)

Forrester does not openly reject the liberal egalitarian principles or institutions Rawls and others advocate, but she sees their theoretical approach as constricting. She contends that Rawls and philosophers of justice influenced by him have been fixated on formulating moral principles and rules, and that the "overwhelming focus" of these norms "was on questions of distribution and ownership." (p. 274) This "distributive paradigm" is said to limit the possibilities of both political theory and democracy. Justice narrows our political focus to questions of individual rights and their equitable distribution. The unremitting discussion of liberal egalitarian justice so conceived has stifled thought and imagination in political philosophy and democratic theory.

One of the primary conclusions Forrester extracts from her history is that Rawls's theory of justice and the liberal egalitarian philosophy his work stimulated are largely irrelevant today. She says that the "tale of philosophical success" she recounts "is also a ghost story, in which Rawls's theory lives on as a spectral presence long after the conditions it describes were gone." (p. xi) Rawls's theory of justice allegedly grew out of post-World War II consensus, prosperity, and optimism, as well as the evolving welfare state. These conditions were ending by the time A Theory of Justice was published in 1971. The late 1960s brought the corrosive effects of the Vietnam War, civil unrest, and race riots; the 1970s delivered economic stagflation and the breakdown of Keynesian consensus; and the 1980s and 1990s saw a rightward turn in politics, ongoing deconstruction of the welfare state, privatization of public functions, and increasing economic globalization. Forrester cites these trends as contributing to current conditions wherein, she says, the redistributive liberal egalitarianism Rawls and others advocate is no longer a realistic possibility. Even so, well into the twenty-first century, "Rawls -- or at least the idea of him -- continued to haunt philosophical debate and provide the referent for his critics as much as for his followers." (p. 270)

Forrester further supports her "ghost story" account by asserting that Rawls's theory of justice is inapplicable and unsuited to address questions that now occupy philosophical discussion: global injustice and refugees, racial injustice and reparations, gender inequality, animal rights, disability injustice, climate justice, environmental justice, epistemic injustice, and "non-state relations of social domination." (p. 273) Here, Forrester is voicing a controversial philosophical claim put forth by Rawls's many critics: that Rawls's liberal egalitarianism neglects and does not have the conceptual means to address so many of the issues that occupy contemporary philosophy on the left.


We are in a period of heightened criticism of Rawls's views. This is part of a more general controversy about the weakness of "liberalism" and the perceived need to move beyond it to properly identify and respond to the glaring defects of current institutions. Forrester's book is a contribution to this debate. It raises important questions: What political philosophy do we need for dealing with contemporary political issues? Is Rawls's theory an appropriate starting point for addressing them? Or do we need to move beyond egalitarian liberalism? The book's flaws lie in the conclusions Forrester extracts from the history she relates, that Rawls's theory is not up to the task of addressing contemporary issues and has become irrelevant to our times.

Forrester reviews many criticisms of Rawls's theory, but rarely discusses or even mentions the many replies by philosophers, including Rawls, who rebut these criticisms. Her ongoing review of criticisms sometimes reads like a deconstructive assault on every major aspect of Rawls's work. Parfit's objections to the notion of personal identity "dissolved the self" that Rawls's conception of justice allegedly presupposes. Beitz, Barry, and global egalitarians made the obvious inference Rawls could not see: because the society we are born into is arbitrary, distributive justice must be global in reach and not contained within national boundaries. Rawls's "romantic" understanding of the civil rights movement belied the white backlash, ignored black nationalists' aims, and misrepresented Martin Luther King's aspirations for something more radical than integration into liberal institutions. Leaving this catalog of criticisms unanswered bolsters Forrester's primary thesis, that Rawls's conception of justice is outdated and incapable of addressing the pressing political injustices of our day. But Rawls himself vigorously responded to these criticisms. He denied that he presupposes any metaphysical conception of the self, whether the self as enduring substance or as pure willing subject that Parfit and Michael Sandel respectively attribute to him. Regarding global justice, Rawls recognized duties of fair trade and international assistance to meet peoples' basic needs, but held that distributive justice is grounded in fair reciprocity among democratic citizens engaged in social and political cooperation, which does not exist at the global level. Finally, Rawls did not ignore white racism but, like King, rejected violence as an effective remedy to it; moreover, Rawls's egalitarian conception coincides with King's aspirations for economic justice.

Forrester provides little argument to support the contention that the disappearance of the historical conditions Rawls's work allegedly "describes" (p .xi) also undermines the relevance of liberal egalitarian conceptions of justice to critical assessment and reform of today's social and political circumstances. But this is not a historical correlation. It is a philosophical claim Forrester makes regarding the continuing application of philosophical ideas to changing historical circumstances. Within philosophy, it is not a weakness but rather a virtue of philosophical concepts, principles, and ideals that they survive the historical circumstances from which they grew and continue to evolve and exert intellectual influence. Philosophical principles and concepts are not like public policies. Public policies are designed to apply to existing circumstances; philosophical ideas function at a level of abstraction that applies to diverse times and circumstances. Far from being irrelevant to present historical conditions, Rawls's and other liberal egalitarian accounts of justice could hardly be more pertinent to the challenges we currently face.

For example, Rawls's difference principle -- that economic inequalities must maximally benefit the least advantaged -- buttresses critical assessments of the vast inequalities of the New Gilded Age. The priority that Rawls's equal basic liberties assign to democracy and equal opportunity of political influence, freedom of political expression, and the rule of law brings into clear focus some of what is at stake in the Trump era, with its relentless assaults on the integrity of democratic institutions, as well as the creeping authoritarianism now descending upon Western democracies. Forrester acknowledges on the last full page of her book that "Liberal egalitarianism is an unparalleled resource for schemes to organize and justify property distributions and limit inequality." (p. 279) But this admission only partly captures the enormous relevance of Rawls's and others' works to salvaging and reforming liberal and democratic institutions now jeopardized.

Rawls's critics charge that the difference principle effectively makes welfare state capitalism, with its considerable inequalities, a permanent element of democratic societies. But Rawls argues in his later works that no form of capitalism, even the capitalist welfare state, satisfies his principles of justice, because capitalism puts no restrictions on inequalities or concentrations of wealth, and inevitably results in the vast majority of people having no economic wealth or discretionary powers and prerogatives in their employment. Consequently, the capitalist welfare state undermines the "fair value" of equal political liberties, fair equality of opportunities, fair economic reciprocity, and disadvantaged citizens' sense of self-respect. Rawls already says in Theory that the economic system that satisfies his principles of justice is a "property-owning democracy" or liberal socialism. He understands property-owning democracy as a regulated market system in which capitalism's gross inequalities and concentrations of wealth are eliminated, shares of wealth are widely distributed among all society's members, and workers may exercise greater freedom, powers, and responsibilities within firms and their workplace. Although Forrester concedes that Rawls explicitly endorsed property-owning democracy even before Theory, she says he only distinguished it from the welfare state late in life, in the 1999 revised edition. But the radical implications of Rawls's difference principle were clear from the beginning.

Forrester contends that Rawls's inordinate focus on laws and institutions means his principles cannot be applied to assess non-institutional contexts such as unfair division of labor within the family or private associations, or encourage altruistic relationships, or address social domination in gender, racial, employment, familial, and other interpersonal relations. This overlooks the crucial role of the moral duties and obligations for individuals and informal associations that are necessary to realize the institutional requirements of justice. These include "natural duties" to uphold just institutions, and to promote them if they do not exist; duties of mutual respect for others as equal moral persons; mutual aid and assistance to others in need or subjected to injustice; duties of civility; duties not to harm and "not to be made the agent of grave injustice and evil"; obligations of fairness and fidelity; imperfect duties of beneficence; and so on. These individual duties and obligations apply to problems of "local justice" in interpersonal relations; they counter Forrester's criticism by providing a foundation to address precisely the non-institutional relations and local injustices she highlights. Employers, spouses, colleagues, and others who act unfairly in interpersonal relations, or behave in ways that are dominating, exploitive, racist, sexist, or otherwise harmful, do not comply with many of these natural duties and obligations. Critics of Rawls neglect or ignore these and other crucial requirements of interpersonal morality in his theory. Forrester often complains that Rawls relies too heavily on moral principles and rules, which might appear inadequate to address systemic injustices. When we are dealing with non-institutional contexts, however, it is hard to see what the alternative is to moral remedies of this kind. A just society is measured not merely by the coercive laws and institutional structures it contains, but by the culture of respect and fairness that informs citizens' relations to each other.

Finally, Forrester claims that Rawls's and liberal egalitarians' focus on formulating moral principles and rules restricts political imagination and theoretical possibilities. But many of Rawls's most important ideas do not involve either principles or rules that must be respected in given situations. They are considerations that should be relevant to any political conception. These include the essential role of basic social institutions in determining social and economic justice, such as the legal specification of rights of private property and permissible contracts; the idea that what we economically deserve presupposes a just economic system; the rejection of "careers open to talent" as an adequate conception of equal opportunity; the recognition that our sense of self-respect depends upon being publicly recognized and respected as social and political equals; and democratic citizens' duty to justify the political positions they advocate according to shared "public reasons" others can accept as free and equal democratic citizens


Forrester contends that Rawls's theory of justice presupposes historical conditions long since passed and that this helps to explain its overreliance on legalistic rules of distribution. She bases this contention on her research into unpublished sources (housed in the Rawls Archives at Harvard University), including his letters, lectures, and papers from the early 1950s until his death in 2002. She finds that Rawls's early thinking was influenced by Wittgenstein and by Hart and other ordinary language philosophers at Oxford in the early 1950s, when Rawls was a Fulbright Fellow there. Forrester argues that these philosophers' emphasis on consensus, agreement in judgments, social rules, conventions, and practices restricted Rawls's understanding of justice and the conditions needed for the establishment of a society and its political institutions. This intellectual background, she alleges, underpins Rawls's ongoing concern with the conditions of social cooperation and the central role of rules and principles, social institutions, and consensus. This occludes the reality of moral disagreement and competition of interests in politics, and the disruption of consensus and political conflict essential to meaningful political change.

Surprisingly, Forrester further claims, based seemingly on inferences from Rawls's unpublished lectures, that in the early 1950s he endorsed a "minimalist barebones liberalism" akin to Hayek's, and "displayed anti-statist sympathies," minimizing the role of the state in social life. This is puzzling since (aside from being a lifelong progressive Democrat) Rawls says in these same early lectures that government should assure a roughly equal start for people and "a fairly wide distribution of property; we want a property-owning democracy where everybody has a stake," which requires "constant policing" to keep things even.[1] Given the egalitarian character that Rawls requires institutions to have and that it is the role of the government to preserve, this is a long way from a laissez faire view. Rawls consistently advocated regulated markets for allocating productive factors, and he never defended purely market distributions of income and wealth. In Theory, Rawls envisions considerable regulation and redistribution within a market economy to mitigate excessive inequality, maintain fair equal opportunities and the fair value of political liberties, and widespread distribution of income, wealth, and powers and prerogatives.

Hayek made a similar mistake in misinterpreting Rawls. As Forrester notes in support of her charge of Rawls's minimal liberalism (p. 14), Hayek says that he "had no basic quarrel with" Rawls.[2] Hayek initially took Rawls's proceduralist view -- that outcomes are just if they result from institutions of the right kind -- as an important point of agreement between them. Hayek later acknowledged that he was mistaken and that there was a great distance between their views; for he had failed to understand the strongly egalitarian constraints that Rawls placed on just institutions, ones that he would never accept.[3]

Forrester also maintains that Rawls's conception of democracy is truncated. In Rawls's account of deliberative democracy, citizens are not to vote their personal interests or religious and moral values, but rather deliberate and vote on requirements of justice and the common good according to shared "public reasons" all can reasonably accept as democratic citizens. Drawing on Rawls's critics, Forrester claims that, because Rawls holds that economic justice and the difference principle is philosophically decided before the establishment of a political system that abides by it, distributive justice is not a subject for democratic deliberation; nor evidently are questions about how to regulate the economy or shape social and economic institutions. She considers his conception of democracy depoliticizing, "a politics of ideal speech detached from social movements" because it removes distributive justice from the democratic arena. (p. 273) This creates a "democratic deficit," coming at the expense of democratic self-determination by active citizens.

Forrester misconstrues Rawls's commitment to democracy and the role of his conception of justice within it. Rawls says the audience for political philosophy in a democratic society is the body of citizens, and his conception of justice is addressed foremost to them. It articulates a conception of democratic equality and the common good that is to educate and guide the judgments of conscientious citizens as they exercise their equal powers of political participation. Rawls provides a means for thinking about politics and suggests reasons, principles, and ideals we might consider in coming to political decisions about important issues. The decision to apply Rawls's ideas to democratic deliberations ultimately is for citizens to make, not philosophers or bureaucratic experts. Rawls's philosophical arguments are an intervention in the democratic debate about justice. He is not telling others what they must think any more than anyone else who offers an opinion on these important matters.[4]

Moreover, Rawls contends that equal political liberties are among the basic rights and liberties. Maintaining the "fair value" of political liberties requires substantially mitigating economic inequalities to enable all citizens to have "a roughly equal chance of influencing government's policies and attaining political authority irrespective of their economic and social class."[5] This is one reason Rawls rejects welfare state capitalism since it permits economic inequalities that inevitably distort the fair value of citizens' equal political liberties. To apply Rawls's principles to contemporary U.S. politics: there is something deeply unjust about a democracy in which concentrated wealth largely controls the political agenda, and political appeals regularly mobilize fabricated facts and racist, sectarian, and self-aggrandizing considerations that undermine the equal rights, liberties, opportunities, and basic needs of citizens, not to mention the rule of law itself. The integrity of democratic institutions has broken down.


Another criticism Forrester makes in support of her contention that Rawls's theory cannot respond to many contemporary issues is his reliance on "ideal theory": the assessment of moral principles by reference to whether they could be fully accepted and adhered to within a hypothetical ideal or "well-ordered society." Many critics argue that Rawls's assumption of everyone's "strict compliance" with basic principles in a "perfectly just society" ignores realities of our non-ideal world.[6] That Rawls's theory is designed to apply to such an ideal society allegedly renders Rawls's principles of justice inapplicable to societies such as ours, marked by economic, political, racial, sexist, and other injustices. This is another version of Forrester's irrelevance claim.

This conclusion is mistaken. Rawls clearly conceives his principles of justice as providing the foundation for assessing actual injustices in our society. He says American society still contains "grave injustices" and that existing political, social, and economic inequalities violate his principles of equal political liberties, equality of fair opportunities, and economic justice.[7] Also, the natural moral duties of mutual respect, mutual assistance, civility, fairness, prohibitions against harm and so on condemn interpersonal relations of dominance, exploitation, and conduct that undermines anyone's sense of self-respect as social equals. The primary purpose of the principles of justice and the natural moral duties is precisely to enable us to critically assess existing injustices, providing a basis for reforming laws, institutions, social norms, and individuals' conduct under our non-ideal and so often unjust circumstances. There would be no point in conjecturing what universal principles and institutions hold under conditions of full compliance in an ideal society if these were not also applicable to determine the nature and extent of injustice in our non-ideal society.

Ideal theory articulates what justice requires and identifies injustice. "Non-ideal theory" tells us what to do to address and remedy injustice. It presupposes and supplements ideal theory. Rawls acknowledges that his conception of justice requires such supplementation to remedy pressing social, political, and economic injustices. He discusses curbing the liberties of intolerant and violent sects, principles of civil disobedience, conscientious refusal to comply with unjust laws and commands, assistance to burdened societies, and just war doctrine, and mentions retributive justice and militant resistance as sometimes necessary to remedy injustice. He recognized that preferential treatment for racial and ethnic minorities is needed to remedy a long and continuing history of unjust discrimination.[8] Additional examples he mentions are corrective and compensatory justice, including reparations, that remedy civil and criminal wrongs, such as violations of individuals' basic rights and liberties, and infringements of their fair equal opportunities through racial, gender, and other forms of unjust discrimination. But each of these non-ideal theories of rectification presupposes and supplements an account of the specific requirements of justice and natural duties that have been violated and that need to be realized or restored. Ideal theory addresses such foundational issues. There is no non-ideal theory of rectification of injustice without an ideal theory that specifies justice's requirements, and guides our reflections about appropriate and effective remedies for their violation.

Still, Forrester resolutely claims, "Many aspects of the Rawlsian vision . . . make it seem unable to deal with the current political situation, as these recent critics have suggested. Its long neglect of 'non-ideal' realities, interests, and ideologies have been shown to be untenable." (p. 277) But this is a tendentious conclusion she does not argue for, and though often repeated by Rawls's critics, it has not been demonstrated by them either. Many left-liberal philosophers use Rawls's theory to grapple with non-ideal issues. For example, Tommie Shelby relies upon the Rawlsian theory to address racial injustice, as does Gina Schouten in addressing gender injustice. Recent accounts of rights of refugees to asylum, immigration, and social membership by Michael Blake and Sarah Song apply Rawls's principles and ideas, as do works on environmental and climate justice,[9] justice and disabilities,[10] and other subjects. Even longstanding critic Charles Mills incorporates Rawls's original position and veil of ignorance into his theory of reparations.[11] Rather than casting a "shadow of justice," Rawls's systemic works provide illumination for contemporary non-ideal theories of justice, serving as "a theoretic lingua franca" that has few parallels in the history of political philosophy.[12]


Thanks especially to Paul Weithman and to many others for their help and suggestions.


[1] Forrester p. 16, quoting from Rawls's 'Lecture on the Function of Government' -- the same Cornell lecture Forrester cites on p. 14, n. 98 to support her claim of Rawls's anti-statism.

[2] Hayek, Law, Liberty, and Legislation, vol.2: The Mirage of Social Justice, (University of Chicago Press, 1978) p. 100; see also p. xiii.

[4] On this see Joshua Cohen, 'For a Democratic Society,' in The Cambridge Companion to Rawls, Samuel Freeman ed. (Cambridge Univ. Press, 2003) pp. 86-138.

[5] Rawls, Justice as Fairness: A Restatement, p. 46.

[6] These include Amartya Sen, Charles Mills, Carol Pateman, Gerald Gaus, and David Schmidtz, among others.

[7] Rawls, Political Liberalism, pp. 398, 407. Also, as Forrester reports (p. 126), Rawls explicitly denied at a 1973 APSA session "that the United States is either a just or nearly just society as I define justice. . . . To think this is to fail to work out the implications of the principles of justice."

[8] See Thomas Nagel, 'John Rawls and Affirmative Action,' in The Journal of Blacks in Higher Education 39 (2003): 82-84.

[9] Darrell Moellendorf, The Moral Challenge of Dangerous Climate Change (Cambridge University Press, 2014).

[10] For example, Cynthia Stark, "How to Include the Severely Disabled in a Contractarian Theory of Justice," Journal of Political Philosophy, 15(2): 127-145.

[11] See Charles Mills, Black Rights/White Wrongs: The Critique of Racial Liberalism, (Oxford University Press, 2017), Epilogue.

[12] See William Edmundson, John Rawls: Reticent Socialist, (Cambridge Univ. Press, 2017) p. 12.