Oliver Thorndike

Kant's Transition Project and Late Philosophy: Connecting the Opus postumum and Metaphysics of Morals

Oliver Thorndike, Kant's Transition Project and Late Philosophy: Connecting the Opus postumum and Metaphysics of Morals, Bloomsbury, 2018, 280pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350050303.

Reviewed by Michael Bennett McNulty, University of Minnesota, Twin Cities

The most plausible interpretive theses have an air of familiarity to them. Their proponents assemble pieces that naturally go together, but whose coherence was overlooked or seen only indistinctly.

The substantive historical thesis of Oliver Thorndike's welcome volume has just this quality. According to this thesis, Kant recognized the need in his Critical system for transition from the a priori to the empirical, a need found in the domains of both natural and practical philosophy. It is well known that Kant embarked on a transition from the a priori metaphysical foundations of natural science to empirical physics in his last, unpublished work, the so-called Opus postumum (OP). Thorndike claims that, for Kant, an analogous transition is requisite in the domain of practical philosophy: from the a priori metaphysics of morals to the application of ethics to varying, contingent circumstances. The pieces are conspicuous when pointed out: there is a symmetrical division between a priori principles and their empirical application in both the natural and practical contexts, and, indeed, Kant explicitly draws the parallel between the two transitions in §45 of the Tugendlehre (TL) in the Metaphysik der Sitten (MS), the passage that inspires Thorndike's project. The ensuing constructive project of the book is to exploit the symmetry for profit: to wit, to utilize the mirroring between transitions to reciprocally illuminate the obscure aspects of Kant's natural and practical philosophies.

The book's historical thesis is compelling and plausible. Thorndike's juxtaposition of Kant's 1796-1798 texts on natural and moral philosophy is an innovative contribution to scholarship and brings to the fore important, yet subtle, strands in Kant's late philosophy. Furthermore, Thorndike offers an intriguing account of the moral transition, according to which moral feelings make possible the transition by serving as schemata for the moral law. However, the constructive project of the book is something of an unfulfilled promissory note, and the details of how, precisely, the transitions proceed remain obscure. Although Thorndike defends the idea that both transitions are unfinished and, hence, takes himself to be justified in declining to clarify the particulars, the reader nevertheless wants for further elucidation.

In the following, I provide an overview of the book, offering occasional reflections on Thorndike's argument.

The Preface frames Thorndike's project, usefully motivating his concerns as they emerge from the aforementioned passage from §45 of TL in which Kant draws the parallel between his transition projects. Thorndike subsequently emphasizes his aims: (1) to demonstrate that the need for transition follows from Kant's conceptions of natural and moral philosophy and hence that it is endemic to the Critical philosophy (and not a marginal concern popping up in the mid-1790s); (2) to substantiate the historical point that there is a textual and systematic parallel between the natural and moral transitions; and (3) to prove the constructive point that there is philosophical importance to this symmetry, especially by using it to shed light on the paired transitions and to resolve controversies in Kant's natural and moral philosophies. The subsequent Introduction provides both an overview of the argumentation as well as systematic motivations for the natural and moral transitions.

Chapter 1 bears on the natural transition in Kant's philosophy. Thorndike's primary concern is to show that the need for transition follows from Kant's foundationalist, dynamist theory of natural philosophy. To this end, he characterizes Kant's conception of natural philosophy, describes Kant's first attempt at transition in his Metaphysische Anfangsgründe der Naturwissenschaft (MAN), and details his own interpretation of the transition project of OP as involving a schematism of a priori principles.

Kant's foundationalist conception of natural philosophy stems from the distinction between general, a priori physics and applied, empirical physics found in many of his forerunners, including Christian Wolff and Johann Peter Eberhard (whose Erste Gründe der Naturlehre was used as textbook by Kant in his 1750s and 60s physics lectures).[1] In Kant's system, rational (a priori) physics concerns those properties of matter that are universal, whereas empirical physics pertains to aspects of bodies that vary among different sorts. Kant follows Wolff (and Leibniz) in endorsing dynamism, according to which material phenomena are to be explained by appeal to forces (and not the collisions of impenetrable pieces of matter, as the atomist would have it). For Kant, the basic forces of matter, those that are universal and whose existence is derivable a priori from the nature of matter, are the fundamental attractive and repulsive forces. These forces and their laws are objects of rational physics. In contrast, empirical physics concerns the properties that vary among matters: density, cohesion, elasticity, chemical affinity, and such. Kant's foundationalism consists in the thesis that empirical physics is grounded upon rational physics. Therefore, the demand for a transition from the a priori, fundamental forces of matter to the contingent circumstances of the world falls out of Kant's very conception of natural philosophy and his dynamic theory of matter. Thus, for Thorndike, the transition is not a newly emerging concern in the 1790s, contra other prominent interpretations of OP, including those of Friedman (1992) and Förster (2000).

Thorndike goes on to explain that the General Remark to the Dynamics, a particularly puzzling tract in Kant's MAN, constitutes his Critical-decade attempt at transition. Therein Kant presents a system for empirical physics, suggesting that the phenomena of density, cohesion, elasticity, and chemical dissolution rest on the fundamental forces of matter and serve as the ultimate basis for further natural philosophical explanation. However, according to Thorndike, the Remark fails insofar as Kant lacks any principle for the derivation of these moments, meaning that it falls short of both "systematicity" and "completeness" (p. 93). Thus, Kant tries again during the mid-1790s in the so-called Oktaventwurf (Ok.), the first iteration of the project of OP. In this work, Kant characterizes the transition as providing schemata for the application of rational physics to the world and strives to ground it in the determination of the concept of <body> by the categories, thus achieving the systematicity that the Remark lacked.

Although the idea that the natural transition is a longstanding need for Kant's Critical philosophy is well substantiated by Thorndike, the relationship between rational and empirical physics remains enigmatic. Thorndike, like Kant, characterizes the forces of empirical physics as "derivative," an appropriation of Leibniz's (and, later, Wolff's) primitive/derivative distinction between forces. This distinction is however notoriously murky in Leibniz's thought,[2] and the sense that Thorndike attributes to Kant on derivative forces is little clearer. For example, Thorndike occasionally asserts that the forces of empirical physics "reduce" to those of rational physics (pp. 48, 50 -- 52) but also denies a reductionist picture elsewhere (p. 4). He writes of the forces of empirical physics as being "modifications" (pp. 4, 40, 42, 48n, 50-2, 66) of the fundamental forces, while other times empirical phenomena themselves are the modifications (pp. 37, 56) or empirical laws are modifications of a priori laws (pp. 38, 40). Thus, the design and the details of the natural transition are opaque. While Thorndike makes a compelling case that Kant, like his predecessors, is a sort of natural-philosophical foundationalist, his account would benefit from greater precision, especially insofar as he intends for the natural transition to serve as a model for the moral.

In chapter 2, Thorndike depicts the gap between the rational and empirical aspects of morality, the bridging over of which requires a transition in practical philosophy. Although the austere account of rational morality in Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten and Kritik der praktischen Vernunft (KpV) well characterizes the nature of moral obligation and duty, this account offers little by way of guidance under empirical settings, wherein we are confronted with various relationships, (apparently) competitive and conflicting duties, and individuals in unique circumstances. Nevertheless, Kant is committed to a sort of foundationalism in practical philosophy just as he is in the natural-philosophical context. According to Thorndike, particular duties in empirical circumstances, as well as their prioritization and subordination, must be grounded in the a priori principle of morality, to wit, autonomy. This grounding is the principal aim of the transition project in practical philosophy. Thorndike highlights that the practical transition must (1) anticipate and provide guidance for the systematicity of empirical duties and (2) allow for the application of the a priori laws of morality to contingent situations.

Thorndike's discussion of the systematicity of empirical duties is especially helpful and interesting. For him, systematizing empirical duties makes possible the resolution of casuistic conflicts in morality. As an example of casuistic conflict, Kant asks whether taking a smallpox vaccination, which has the potential to infect oneself despite the goal of inoculation, is in conflict with ones' duty not to harm oneself (MS, 6:424). To decide such a question, one requires a systematic, hierarchical order of apparently conflicting maxims that provides guidance regarding the application of morality to contingent circumstances. This is among the aims of the practical transition.

Chapter 3 describes the framework for Kant's practical transition and extracts implications for our understanding of MS in general. Thorndike's primary thesis is that the moral endowments (or feelings, for Thorndike) discussed in §XII of the introduction to TL -- moral feeling, conscience, love for others, and self-respect -- are the intermediary concepts of the practical transition. They both make possible the grounding of the system of empirical duties in a priori morality and guide moral progress. This is because the moral endowments involve a comparison of one's maxim with the moral law, which produces an aesthetic effect, or a state that can be sensed. By giving sensible expression to the moral law, the moral endowments serve as schemata for it. This receptivity to the law through feeling is essential, according to Thorndike, in order for agents to determine what they ought to do in contingent circumstances and to resolve casuistic conflicts. Furthermore, Thorndike contends, moral feelings bring unity to our intelligible (autonomous) and empirical (sensible) selves: only through them can the empirical self be receptive to the pure moral law.

To adapt an example from Kant (MS, 6:445) discussed by Thorndike (p. 216-17), an agent may be faced with the choice of a career. Say the agent is gifted with an aptitude for mathematics and faces the decision of becoming a high school math teacher or a Wall Street banker. In this case, the bare moral law cannot decide her duties in her complex, contingent situation. Rather, a transition by way of the moral feelings is required, according to Thorndike. In this case, the moral feeling of self-respect is a guide to her empirical duty. Thus, the agent, upon considering using her mathematical talents to enrich the already incredibly wealthy, feels shame. Since the moral feelings are affective reactions to conformity or disagreement between maxims and the moral law, the agent's shame is a sign of discord between her considered career choice and the moral law. The moral feelings do not determine her (or, in general, one's) duty; rather, according to Thorndike, they serve only to guide one in deliberative contexts and when systematizing the maxims that constitute one's empirical character.

Thorndike thereby purports to develop a new account of moral feelings, according to which they are neither motivational (as McCarthy or Grenberg would have it) nor epistemic (as Baron or Baxley would have it). Rather, they are mediatory: the moral feelings serve fundamentally in the practical transition by allowing agents to be receptive to the demands of morality in worldly circumstances. By this, Thorndike means that moral feelings are signals of the (im)morality of maxims or actions. Through paying attention to and cultivating these feelings, we learn how morality applies to our lives.[3]

The relationship between empirical duties and the metaphysics of morals is, however, hazy. In particular, Thorndike's account of the grounding of empirical duties in the principle of morality, opposed to their mere recognition (upon which he focuses), could be spelled out. Although it is clear that, for Thorndike, moral judgment plays a critical role in this grounding, the details lack perspicuity.

Thorndike proceeds to claim that the moral endowments are systematic insofar as they are categorical: that is, they are derived from the categories of freedom of KpV. He argues that the categorical structure of the moral feelings is only revealed by the analogy between OP and MS, an offering of the constructive project of the book. As I mention above, in Ok., the transition project proceeds by presenting the categorical determinations of <body>. Thorndike suggests that since the practical transition is a symmetric project and Kant was writing the introduction to TL around the same time as the Ok., there is good reason to believe that the practical transition also proceeds categorically. In particular, Thorndike argues that the moral endowments stem from the categories of freedom.

In lieu of textual evidence, Thorndike provides just-so stories about the connections between the moral endowments and the categories of freedom. Although tenable, the stories are arbitrary. The reader is left with the impression that, on this point, Thorndike has pushed the analogy between the transitions too far and has perhaps succumbed to the lure of Kant's 'architectonic mania.'

From there, Thorndike proceeds to develop the parallel between OP and MS into an interpretative methodology for the latter. He follows others who think MS to be something of a patchwork text, cobbled together out of ideas from distinct epochs in Kant's thought. Thorndike recommends that we use the analogy between OP and MS as well as explicit references to the transition project as guides through TL.

Ultimately, Thorndike contends that Kant's transition projects founder, because they each fail to account adequately for the systematicity of their respective empirical projects. Specifically, it appears that Kant arrives at the intermediary concepts of transition independently and only wedges them into a categorical framework post hoc. For Thorndike, the moments of the transitions are hence arbitrary and lack the requisite systematicity.

The chief historical thesis of Thorndike's text -- that there is a transition project in Kant's philosophy of both nature and morals -- is plausible and well supported. This historical portrait of Kant is a virtue in its own right. Moreover, I concur that the need for transition is abiding and not a late-emerging, marginal issue. Furthermore, Thorndike's conception of how the practical transition proceeds gives rise to a thought-provoking reconceptualization of the moral endowments as schemata for the moral law.

However, I question the extent to which Thorndike makes good on the constructive aims of the book: the exploitation of the parallel transition projects to elucidate Kant's philosophy. The discussion of the new light shed on the contours of Kant's moral thought, in general, is brief (pp. 206-17), though this may be a fruitful avenue for future research. But, moreover, I have qualms with the way the parallel transition projects are used to illuminate each other. First, many superficial aspects of the moral transition could be well motivated and substantiated without making use of the natural philosophical analogy. Second, the most substantive exploitation of the symmetry that goes beyond the superficial -- namely, the above-discussed argument from the categoricity of the natural transition to the categoricity of the moral endowments -- is dubious and pushes the analogy too far. Third, there are acute disanalogies between the natural and moral transitions that are neglected in the book: for example, that the moral transition involves the unification of the intelligible and sensible selves, whereas the poles of the natural transition are both sensible, and that the natural transition involves the hypothesis (and later proof) of a material condition of the possibility of experience (the aether). Collectively, these issues impugn the reliability of leveraging the parallel between the transition projects, bifurcate the book into its natural and the moral segments, and leave the reader wanting a satisfying fulfillment of the constructive promissory note.

Nonetheless, even without conclusive and substantive use of the parallel between the transition projects, Thorndike's book is worthwhile for Kant scholars in virtue of highlighting that seemingly familiar parallel and offering evocative accounts of each transition. The crux of Thorndike's interpretation -- bringing Kant's OP into sustained dialogue with his broader corpus and MS, in particular -- is novel and compelling. I agree with Thorndike that there is much work left to be done in this vein (p. 242), but his account serves as a fruitful first step in the direction of a reconceptualization of Kant's natural and practical philosophy.


Thanks to Peter Hanks, Sarah Holtman, Qiannan Li, and Oliver Thorndike for feedback on an earlier draft.


Adams, Robert Merrihew. Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist. Oxford University Press, 1994.

Förster, Eckart. Kant's Final Synthesis: An Essay on the Opus postumum. Harvard University Press, 2000.

Friedman, Michael. Kant and the Exact Sciences. Harvard University Press, 1992.

Van den Berg, Hein. Kant on Proper Science: Biology in the Critical Philosophy and the Opus postumum. Springer, 2014.

[1] Van den Berg (2014) also examines Kant’s assimilation of the distinction between general and special physics from his predecessors, including Wolff and Eberhard.

[2] Robert Adams writes that the relationship between primitive and derivative forces is “probably the largest obstacle to understanding the relationship between Leibniz’s physics and Leibnizian metaphysics” (1994, 378).

[3] Notably, Thorndike disagrees with the epistemic readings insofar as they take moral feelings to be tools to recognize moral salience, which allow one to judge what is morally relevant in contingent scenarios. Although, according to Thorndike’s mediatory account of moral feelings, they play an epistemic role, of a sort, it is not the same epistemic role that the existing literature attributes to them.