Robert C. Stalnaker

Knowledge and Conditionals: Essays on the Structure of Inquiry

Robert C. Stalnaker, Knowledge and Conditionals: Essays on the Structure of Inquiry, Oxford University Press, 2019, 252pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198810346.

Reviewed by Fabrizio Cariani, University of Maryland, College Park

The book is a collection of thirteen essays devoted to themes in formal epistemology, philosophy of language, metaphysics and logic. Robert C. Stalnaker advertises it as a spiritual successor to his 1984 classic Inquiry. Indeed, the book is like Inquiry in two important respects. For one obvious thing, it follows a similar structural arc. Much as Inquiry's first half is devoted to the concept of belief, the first half of the book develops a constellation of views on the nature of knowledge and on its relation to belief and credence. The shift of focus from belief to knowledge is an explicit nod to the knowledge-first program associated with Timothy Williamson's work. The second half is dedicated to -- you guessed it -- conditionals, as well as to some related modal concepts. In this respect, it also mirrors and amplifies the related developments of the second half of Inquiry. Another respect of similarity that is worth highlighting is that both the book and Inquiry exemplify a kind of de-compartmentalized approach to the philosophical enterprise -- one in which sub-disciplinary boundaries, say, between philosophy of language and metaphysics, are largely ignored in service of cohesive philosophical theorizing.

Some of the chapters in the book have been available for some time as published articles and are well-known. Chapter 9 is a reprint of "A Theory of Conditionals" (1968). I don't have much to say about this that would fit in a book review, except that this paper is one of the landmark achievements of twentieth century philosophy and I am happy to see it easily available and nicely formatted.

Another more recent classic, but of the underground variety, is "On Logics of Knowledge and Belief" (2006), reprinted here as chapter 1. This essay is a systematic study of philosophical and formal themes in epistemic logic. At its core, it is the study of a joint modal logic for belief and knowledge. Here is a quick summary of its stunning central finding: start with basic, separate logics for belief and knowledge. Next, add some basic principles governing the interaction of belief and knowledge. These range from the uncontroversial claim that you believe what you know, to idealizations such as introspection principles, to the substantive philosophical claim that believing p entails believing that one knows p. This theoretical package entails the extraordinary consequence that one believes a proposition p if and only if one does not know that it's not the case that one knows p. Belief turns out to be equivalent to epistemically possible knowledge. A consequence of this result that is elaborated at some length is that it is possible to highlight critical structural features of the concept of belief in terms of a knowledge operator endowed with a sufficiently rich logic. This logic for knowledge is itself stronger than S4, and thus allows positive introspection for knowledge, but weaker than S5, thus denying negative introspection.

Chapter 2 articulates Stalnaker's defense of the KK principle in the form of a response to Williamson's anti-luminosity argument, and several other essays in part 1 deal with themes concerning the iteration of epistemic states.

Chapter 10 is a reprint of "Conditional Propositions and Conditional Assertion" -- Stalnaker's contribution to the influential collection edited by Andy Egan and Brian Weatherson on epistemic modality. A dozen years hence, this remains one of the most lucid comparisons of probabilistic "no-truth-value" views of conditional sentences (à-la Edgington 1986) and propositional analyses of conditionals. And a dozen years hence, I remain convinced of Stalnaker's case that we don't have to choose between conditionals expressing constraints on credences and the systematic goals of semantics.[1]

The remaining essays are new, or newish. In addition to some articles published in recent collections, the volume includes four unpublished essays as well as two essays that are due to come out in collections that at the time of publication -- and in fact at the time of this writing -- are still forthcoming. Also newly written for the volume is a helpful introduction that illuminates some threads connecting the different essays.

The new essays are philosophically rich and rewarding. Setting the philosophy aside for a moment, they stand out to me for their distinctive voice and pace. To be more specific, these essays seem designed to set up an imaginary dialogue between Stalnaker and other major figures of the last fifty years or so of analytic philosophy.

On this reading, part I is an elaborate reply to Williamson's Knowledge and Its Limits. Stalnaker endorses Williamson's case for a knowledge-first approach in epistemology, but wants to make room for more iteration-friendly principles and for a somewhat different conception of knowledge (a bit more on this below). As for part II, after the aforementioned reprint of "A Theory of Conditionals", the main interlocutors are Dorothy Edgington on conditionals, and then David Lewis on objective modalities and on Humean reduction. Stalnaker endorses Edgington's emphasis on the importance of probabilities of conditionals, as well as the idea that such probabilities are central to a fully developed theory of inquiry and discourse. However, he argues that much of what Edgington has urged does not require despairing about the prospects for a proper semantics for conditionals. The final couple of chapters of the book move on to Lewis and objective modalities, arguing that Lewis was right in seeking an analysis of objective modalities within the modeling framework of possible worlds, but wrong in leaning too hard into the impossibly hard reductive ambitions of the Humean project.

This dialogical design is particularly prominent in the broader ranging essays, "Contextualism and the Logic of Knowledge" and "Dispositions and Chance", that conclude each of the two parts.

While reading the essay on contextualism, I felt transported to one of those oddly shaped rooms in MIT's Stata Center. This reverie included Stalnaker teaching a seminar on Lewis's "Elusive Knowledge" (Lewis 1996). The essay, and the imaginary seminar, begins with a summary of Lewis's view, drawing attention to two important technical tasks: how to model the kind of context dependence Lewis assigns to knowledge ascriptions; and how to capture Lewis's analysis within a Hintikka-style framework for knowledge. Stalnaker goes on to note that the design principles informing Lewis's theory force the acceptance of a restricted symmetry principle for the accessibility relation underlying the Hintikka-style analysis. Acceptance of restricted symmetry, however, exposes the theory to counterexamples.[2]

In response, Stalnaker builds up an alternative account of knowledge -- what he calls the "information theoretic" account. Information-processing agents, be it people or thermostats, may find themselves in one of many states. In normal circumstances, these states are appropriately responsive to the environment, in the sense that the state might hold if and only if the matching environmental conditions hold. In normal circumstances, an agent's knowing a proposition p is a matter of that agent's state being associated with environmental conditions that entail p. This view is integrated with a kind of contextualism: whether attributors of knowledge take some normality conditions to hold (or fail to hold, as the case might be) can affect the truth, and the content, of the knowledge ascriptions themselves. While I found this essay inspiring, I wished it provided both more detail and also a more systematic presentation of the connections between the particular details that are, in fact, spelled out.

Much as the chapter on contextualism and knowledge is a response to Lewis's "Elusive Knowledge", the final chapter of the book, "Dispositions and Chance", cobbles together a picture of chance by interacting with Goodman, De Finetti, and Lewis. The holy grail of a theory of chance (and mutatis mutandis of other objective modalities) is a thin form of realism that is short of the Humean reductionism defended by Lewis. Stalnaker's proposal is that objective modal concepts are "a kind of projection of epistemic states and policies onto the world" (p. 2). This "projection strategy" was originally applied to conditionals already in Inquiry. The main idea seems to be that to get to the concept of chance, say, we start with some features of subjective credence (perhaps that it is partial, that it is representable by probability functions, or whatever list you'd want to compile). Then, somehow, we abstract these features away, sever their connection to a subject of ascription, and use them to differentiate ways the world might be. The "projection strategy" consists in the endorsement of this as a legitimate pathway to concept formation. Here, as in Inquiry, there are components to the projection strategy whose presentation remains too metaphorical to pin down the position with precision, and to quash the feeling that the defender of the strategy is trying to have their cake and eat it too.

Although I have much enjoyed reading this book -- and I expect to enjoy re-reading some of its component essays in the future -- there are some missed opportunities. I was excited to see an essay titled "Counterfactuals and Probability". The development of a plausible and triviality-free account of counterfactual probabilities strikes me as one of the most important challenges at the intersection of epistemology, philosophy of language and metaphysics. In addition to making clear contact with internal problems in these areas, it is of great practical significance. And moreover, we are exposed to much common sense skepticism about it, in the form of claims to the effect that there is no way to know -- or even have rational expectations about -- how things might have turned out under some counterfactual hypothesis.

However, the essay included in this collection does not seem to me to advance the theoretical landscape much. It restates some (admittedly important) views that are already associated with Stalnaker. Primary among these is the view that, instead of modeling counterfactual credences in terms of distributions over sets of worlds, we might do so in terms of distributions over sets of pairs of worlds and selection functions (or at any rate similarly complex objects). But the essay is silent on many central questions: why are these non-standard objects suitable to play a content role? How are these credences in non-standard contents to interact with standard credences?

As a separate concern, Stalnaker analogizes his seminal doctrine of indeterminacy in selection functions to claims to the effect that the future is indeterminate. But, at first sight, these appear to be radically different forms of indeterminacy -- one semantic, the other metaphysical. These differences in the nature of the relevant indeterminacy may be consequential to the theory of rational credence in ways that are not expanded upon. These challenges are not insurmountable, but I find it impossible to evaluate the success and implications of the account without greater clarity on these issues. Additionally, it felt as a lacuna that the chapter does not seem to engage with much existing work on counterfactual probabilities.[3]

At several points in the collection, Stalnaker's presentation feels too dense for me to follow comfortably. This is not an uncommon feeling when reading Stalnaker's work, and not one that is due to obscurity of any individual point. Instead, it is that information is packed into deceptively short, superficially simple, but in reality quite dense passages. Some of these passages -- many of which are no longer than a single paragraph -- might warrant stretching into whole articles. With that said, experiences teaches that, when it comes to Stalnaker's work, this discomfort is best embraced. I look forward to the elation of digesting the exact structure of these arguments (and maybe involuntarily recycling one or two) in the next couple decades.


Thanks to Simon Goldstein, Matt Mandelkern, Damien Rochford and Paolo Santorio for comments and discussion.


Edgington, D. 1986. 'Do conditionals have truth conditions?' Critica 18: 3-30.

Lewis, D. 1996. 'Elusive knowledge', Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74: 549-997.

Salow, Bernhard 2016. 'Lewis on iterated knowledge'. Philosophical Studies 173: 1571-1590

Schulz, Moritz 2017. Counterfactuals and probability. Oxford University Press.

Schwarz, Wolfgang 2018. 'Subjunctive Conditional Triviality'. Journal of Philosophical Logic 47: 47-66.

Stalnaker, R. 1968. 'A theory of conditionals,' in Studies in Logical Theory, ed. by N. Rescher. Oxford: Blackwell, 98-112.

Williams, Robert 2012. 'Counterfactual Triviality: A Lewis-Impossibility Argument for Counterfactuals.' Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 85 (3): 648-670.


[1] Whether we can also get a semantics that yields truth-conditions properly so called is an issue on which I am a little less bullish than Stalnaker.

[2] The discussion in Salow (2016) looms large here, although Stalnaker interprets some central findings from Salow (2016) differently. 

[3] Here I am thinking (i) of contributions to the literature on counterfactual triviality such as Williams (2012) and Schwarz (2018); (ii) of Schulz's 2017 book Counterfactuals and Probability; and (iii) of the rather different tradition of thinking about counterfactuals and probability within the causal inference literature. I will also take this opportunity to shout out some current work-in-progress that I believe will advance this discussion substantially. In separate works, Justin Khoo, Paolo Santorio, and Ginger Schultheis are all exploring Stalnaker-inspired analyses of counterfactual probabilities that make contact with the issues I raise in the text.