2018.10.12

John K. Davis

New Methuselahs: The Ethics of Life Extension

John K. Davis, New Methuselahs: The Ethics of Life Extension, MIT Press, 2018, 354pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262038133.

Reviewed by Nicholas Agar, University of Wellington


John K. Davis advances a bold claim about human life extension. He argues that we should expeditiously develop and make available technologies that will radically extend human lifespans. An interesting novelty is the book's final chapter in which Davis presents policies that he thinks will speed the arrival of these technologies. Davis's approach to a future made by radical life extension is generally optimistic. He notes, but downplays, possible bad societal consequences and is bullish about a "wiser, more mature, less superficial, less violent, more informed, better educated, and more responsible" collective future that could result from accelerating the arrival of radically extended lifespans. (p. 30) I think that we should be cautious about these optimistic forecasts. We should remember that claims made immediately after the collapse of European communism about the unstoppable global spread of liberal democracy seemed more plausible then than they do now. But this review focuses on Davis's philosophical defences of life extension and not on his predictions. I explain why I found his central arguments unpersuasive.

Davis divides people who will exist when we have life extension technologies that really work into three categories. There are Haves "who have access to life extension (they can afford it) and they get it". There are Will-nots who "have access to life extension (they are just as well-off as the Haves), but unlike the Haves, they turn it down." (p. 29) Then there are the Have-nots who don't have access.

Davis responds differently to each group. He argues that the Haves should have immediate access to whichever proven rejuvenation technologies their money can buy. They should not have to wait until access to life extension is granted to the Have-nots. The Haves should expect to be taxed a bit more to subsidize access for the Have-nots. (p. 156) It seems to me that if the first effective life extension technologies are very expensive then it might take a good deal more than a tax surcharge targeting rejuvenated billionaires to grant access to the Have-nots. Nevertheless Davis thinks that the fact that some don't get access shouldn't prevent others.

My first complaint concerns the way Davis markets life extension to individuals who are inclined to reject it. He could have pursued a philosophically constructive strategy to win over the Will-nots. He might have focused on the benefits enjoyed by those who radically extend their lifespans. We tend to get these kinds of constructive engagement from transhumanist writers like Nick Bostrom and Mark Walker. Davis's principal strategy is to claim that the Will-nots' rejection of life extension is a "kind of suicide". He makes this case by comparing voluntary disconnection from a life support machine to the rejection of established life extension therapies. Davis argues that if you think that deliberately disconnecting yourself from life support machine is a form of suicide then so is deliberately foregoing life extension. He allows that it need not be immoral to commit suicide or to undertake acts that are its moral and prudential equivalent. But he seems to think that the rejection of proven life extension technologies is nevertheless correctly categorized as a rejection of life itself relevantly similar to stereotypical acts of suicide.

One problem here is Davis's oversimplification of the relationship between aging and death. He treats death as a limit that aging takes us closer to. For example, he writes "In the existing human condition, death is a hard limit; we never get much more than a century of life and must arrange our lives within that schedule." (p. 73) The idea that aging takes us closer to a hard limit that we can avoid only by undergoing the fundamental biological revisions of rejuvenation medicine explains the relationship Davis identifies between suicide and rejecting life extension. But this is not a useful way to think about this relationship.

The relationship between aging and death is essentially probabilistic. According to the Gompertz function, named for the 1800s British mathematician and actuary Benjamin Gompertz, if we exclude external causes of death such as car crashes, beyond a certain age the probability of not surviving any given year increases exponentially the longer you live. Davis is aware of this function but does not seem to have grasped its implications. In a version of the Gompertz function he cites "after the age of 30, the odds of dying double every 7 to 10 years (depending on the country)." (p. 256) Davis should really say "dying in any given year" to clarify the function's scope. Beyond a certain age there is an increasing likelihood that each birthday you celebrate will be your last. Rather than speculating about how close Jeanne Calment, the French woman who achieved a lifespan of 122 years 164 days, got to a hard limit on human lifespans, it's more helpful to view her as an extreme statistical outlier. Doubtless she inherited genetic variants that somewhat boosted her odds and her abstemious lifestyle helped. But Calment reached an age at which the doublings of the Gompertz function have predictably killed almost everyone.

This probabilistic account is compatible with what we know about the biology of aging. When viewed at the cellular level, none of the varieties of damage that make our deaths exponentially more probable are logically guaranteed. For example, the process of cell division that replaces dead or damaged cells is very accurate. Cells have impressive repair mechanisms. But human bodies comprise trillions of cells. Over time, copying errors accumulate and damage goes unrepaired. If we had enough humans we might expect to find one who never aged. Every cell of this remarkably fortunate individual would divide perfectly. All damage to cells caused by environmental mutagens would be perfectly repaired. Of course, to expect one such fortunate human we will need more humans than the typewriting monkeys required to produce Hamlet. On this understanding, the goal of the self-proclaimed immortalists, such as Aubrey de Grey, is more about dramatically decreasing the odds that the damage that living inflicts on each cell will shorten human lives than about bursting through some hard limit.

Davis appears to appreciate that many of your acts or omissions that increase the probability of your death are not suicide. He allows that "merely neglecting your health to the degree that you foreseeably shorten your life is usually not suicide: people who neglect their health typically don't do so in order to shorten their lives." (p. 82) They may just enjoy gluttony and smoking. This is exactly how we can view rejecting radical life extension. If living an unhealthy lifestyle when a healthy lifestyle is available is not suicide then neither is preferring a normal human lifespan when a radically enhanced lifespan is available. Both choices reflect a non-suicidal preference for predictably shorter lifespans.

Is a preference for lifespans that are predictably shorter prudentially irrational? I think not. It can be prudentially rational to undertake acts that expose you to a high probability of death. It's not necessarily prudentially irrational to seek to climb Everest. Suppose that, as you prepare for the final stage of your ascent, the weather deteriorates. You are told that, should you continue, it is very likely you will die. Continuing may be reckless. Deciding whether it is requires an assessment of how much reaching Everest's summit matters to you. Might you abort this attempt and try again later? These assessments may be hampered by the cognitive effects of hypoxia that climbers experience as they traverse Everest's death zone. But continuing the climb is not suicidal, as you hope to survive; you won't view surviving in the way that someone who earnestly desires to die views a failed suicide attempt. If summiting Everest really is of utmost importance to you and this is very likely to be your last opportunity to do it, it need not be prudentially irrational to continue climbing.

Answering the question of whether it is prudentially rational to reject radical life extension requires an assessment of the value to you of a recognizably human life. Typical human lives tend to feature the seven stages of life described in Shakespeare's As You Like It, from infant, "Mewling and puking in the nurse's arms" through to old age "Sans teeth, sans eyes, sans taste, sans everything". If you elect to live that kind of life you aren't committing suicide. Depending on the value you place on that kind of life, your choice can be prudentially rational.

In earlier work I have described such values as species relative. We have a provisional commitment to living longer, being stronger, and getting smarter. Our commitment to these improvements is conditional on other, potentially competing prudential and moral commitments. Humans tend to value the distinctive relationships they form with other humans. It's not irrational to be cautious of modifications that may weaken these bonds. Of course, there is nothing rationally compulsory about this. Thoroughgoing transhumanists may not feel the pull of human species-relative values. But they shouldn't suppose that what could be best for them is necessarily best for all of us. We shouldn't expect values that motivate some humans to reject life extension and other radical enhancements to appeal to extra-terrestrials whose prudential values are attuned to their millennial lifespans. They will be unmoved by our species-relative arguments. And that's what we should expect of local values. The most cherished locations in your hometown may not be those with the greatest appeal to tourists. When many of us express a preference for classic human lives we don't purport to be offering reasons that will appeal to extra-terrestrials or thoroughgoing (rather than self-deceived) transhumanists. This choice is not suicide nor is it prudentially irrational.

What claim does the goal of radical life extension have on private and public money? Davis calls the argument that there are more morally important things to do the "pressing needs objection". According to one presentation of this argument "We should devote resources to bringing the poor up to middle-class standards before we let the rich live extended lives and fight diseases that shorten life before extending lives beyond a normal span." (p. 149) It seems to me that something like the pressing needs argument is behind the annoyed response to the observation of Jeff Bezos, the world's richest person, that there is simply not enough philanthropic need here on Earth for his many billions. Bezos said "The only way that I can see to deploy this much financial resource is by converting my Amazon winnings into space travel."[1] In addition to investing in sending humans into space, Bezos is a significant funder of life extension research. Bezos shows comparatively little interest in the more traditional philanthropic goals that motivated Bill Gates to set up the Bill and Melinda Gates Foundation.

Davis allows that traditional philanthropic needs may be more pressing, but he insists "it does not follow that life extension should not be made available until other, more pressing needs have been met." (p. 150) He makes a distinction between total planners -- those who take it upon themselves to arrange the distribution of all a society's goods -- and partial planners -- who have only limited control over how goods are distributed in their society. Among partial planners are "private parties, politicians, and government officials." (p. 150) Davis suggests that philosophers should be partial planners who acknowledge the non-ideal circumstances of their societies. He says "It may be true that total planners should allocate social resources to other needs first and that there will not be enough left over to fund life extension research, development, and distribution. However, we are not total planners. We must seek justice in a partially unjust world." Committing money to life extension is one way to be a morally good partial planner.

This focus on partial planning wrongly restricts the scope for criticism of actual and proposed arrangements of goods. Suppose you think that your nation commits too much money to its military and not enough to education. You shouldn't be deterred from expressing this view by the suggestion that it is wrong arrogate to yourself the role of the total planner. You don't have a specific list of the schools and tertiary institutions that should get the money that a smaller military budget will free up. You may hope that once you've made a moral case for spending more on education others will be better placed than you to decide which schools and universities should get the money not used to purchase new weapons systems. When billionaires prefer the Jeff Bezos path of philanthropy to the Bill Gates path we can certainly judge that they could have made morally better use of their money while allowing that the money is theirs to spend. Rich people who spend money on Porsches can claim some credit for keeping automotive workers in Stuttgart employed. But they haven't made the best moral use of their money. The same observation applies to those who direct their charitable contributions at developing life extension technologies. If you are allowed to invest in a fleet of Porsches you ought to be allowed to invest in life extension. But you could have done morally better things.

ACKNOWLEDGEMENTS

I am grateful to Simon Keller and Jeff McMahan for comments on this review.

REFERENCES

Agar, N. 2010. Humanity's End: Why We Should Reject Radical Enhancement. MIT Press.

Agar, N. 2013. Truly Human Enhancement: A Philosophical Defense of Limits. MIT Press.

Bostrom, N. 2005. The Fable of the Dragon-Tyrant. Journal of Medical Ethics, 31 (5), 273-277.

Walker, M. 2007. Superlongevity and Utilitarianism. Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 85 (4), 581-595.


[1] Catherine Clifford, "Jeff Bezos says this is how he plans to spend the bulk of his fortune", CNBC Mon, 30 April 2018.