Joseph Levine

Quality and Content: Essays on Consciousness, Representation, and Modality

Joseph Levine, Quality and Content: Essays on Consciousness, Representation, and Modality, Oxford University Press, 2018, 220pp., ISBN 9780198800088.

Reviewed by Frank Jackson, Australian National University

Rhetoric matters in philosophy. David Hilbert's use of "anthropocentric realism" to characterize the view of color he likes is an example. Peter Singer's "animal liberation" needs no introduction.

Joseph Levine's felicitous phrase "the explanatory gap" has shaped much of the recent debate over physicalism (materialism, Levine uses the terms interchangeably) as a theory of mind. This collection of twelve papers incorporates further thoughts on the issues that animated the paper (1983) in which Levine introduced the phrase and the book that followed (2001), along with discussions of related issues in the philosophy of mind. As one would expect given their author, the papers are excellent and the volume should be read by anyone interested in the philosophy of mind. It would be an ideal text for a senior graduate seminar in the philosophy of mind.

Here's a sample of the questions addressed: what, exactly, is the explanatory gap; does it tell physicalists that they should be a posteriori physicalists (type-B physicalists); does the "phenomenal concepts strategy" tell physicalists how to live with the gap ("no", is his answer); what should we say about David Chalmers's attempt using two-dimensionalism to revive the zombie (conceivability of zombies, if you like) argument against physicalism post Kripke and Putnam; can representationalism give a satisfactory account of the phenomenological side of mental life; and, for those like Levine who cannot buy representationalism's account of the phenomenological side of mental life, what is the best replacement for it?

There are some surprises in the volume, or anyway I was surprised. Levine is best known as a physicalist who introduced the explanatory gap: the (alleged) impossibility of explaining to the standard we have come to expect in the physical sciences, how purely physical creatures could have the kinds of conscious states we have. Levine urges that the explanatory gap does not teach us that physicalism is false (while granting that it raises a question that needs an answer). It teaches us that physicalists should eschew a priori physicalism (type-A physicalism) and affirm some suitable version of a posteriori physicalism (type-B physicalism) instead. But in this volume we find passages like

If acquaintance [with phenomenal properties] itself cannot be explained in terms of physical-causal mechanisms, as I claim (at least so far) it can't, then we have to contemplate the possibility that it is a brute relation. If so, then the Materialist Constraint is violated, and materialism is false. (p. 34, my emphasis)

Later, p. 152, we find "I have, in fact, of late come closer to Chalmers in seeing the explanatory gap as a positive argument for non-materialism about consciousness, but where I see the argument as essentially abductive, he sees it as demonstrative." (My emphasis) And, on the last page of the last essay, p. 205, there is an appeal to virtual objects to explain the nature of conscious experience that will not sit well with physicalists. On p. 8, Levine mentions a possible new monograph on conscious experience. Perhaps there he will finally cut the cord and abandon physicalism?

I will restrict my critical comments to a short discussion of what he says about Chalmers on brute necessity (in the context of the debate over modal rationalism), and slightly longer discussions of his account of the phenomenal nature of perceptual experience and his worries about representationalism.

Levine says, p. 155, "I basically agree with Chalmers's distaste for brute necessity, and largely for the reasons he presents". His disagreement is with Chalmers's appeal to what Levine calls "(quasi)descriptivism" (he mentions Frege in this context) and the associated semantics in explaining the famous examples of the necessary a posteriori. Levine's view is that there's no need to enter into a discussion of semantics at all. Here's the key passage:

The basic idea behind the necessity of identity is simple. When an identity statement like "Mark Twain = Samuel Clemens" or "Water = H2O" is true, this entails that we have one item here, not two: a person in the former case and a substance kind in the latter. It's a priori that everything is self-identical, that nothing could possibly fail to be itself, and so the facts expressed by these statements are necessarily true (if true at all). For this insight we don't need any semantic analysis; it's a matter of the a priori nature of logic, including the logic of identity. (pp. 155-156, my emphasis)

Near the bottom of p. 156, Levine summarizes the idea that semantics, be it of a Fregean or direct reference kind, is irrelevant to the debate: "Once the identity claim is accepted, then the necessity comes along for free, as we know a priori that identities are necessary. . . the link between the modal and the epistemic can bypass semantics" (my emphases).

I think this kind of quietism about the necessary a posteriori is a mistake (which may come as no surprise -- full disclosure). If we ignore people undergoing transplants and assume that no two people are exactly the same height, "The tallest person with a liver = the tallest person with a kidney" is true. Surely it would be a mistake to argue, mimicking some of the words quoted above, that it's a priori that everything is self-identical, that nothing could possibly fail to be itself, and so the fact expressed by this statement is necessarily true (if true at all). The statement is a contingent truth.

The two statements, "The tallest person with a liver = the tallest person with a kidney" and "Water = H2O", are alike in one regard, they are both a posteriori truths; and are different in another regard, only the second is a necessary truth (or maybe it is "Any water = H2O" which is necessary). We need an explanation of this datum, and semantics will have to enter into any plausible explanation of it. I am not here saying that direct reference theorists cannot explain the datum, although I in fact believe that they cannot. That's another issue. I am saying that one cannot avoid entering semantic waters.

I now turn to Levine's treatment of phenomenal character, and I should emphasise that his treatment is avowedly exploratory. The key idea, sketched in the last two chapters, is to resurrect a kind of Cartesian theater account (the title of the last chapter is "Phenomenal Experience: A Cartesian Theater Revival"). Here's an illustrative quote from p. 205: "having conscious experience just is a matter of constructing, in a Kantian sort of way, a world of appearances. Just maybe." His thought is that the phenomenal character of experience lies in ways of appearing, where these ways of appearing are the way things appear. He wants the character to lie in the way things appear, in order to accommodate the intuitive appeal of transparency. However, these things are, on his account, what he calls virtual objects, and he admits that he does not "know how to make ontological sense of virtual objects" (p. 205).

Are they perhaps sense data under another name? His talk at p. 204 of "Conscious experience [being] . . . a matter of the mind, the subject, being appeared to by an array of virtual objects" (and there are similar phrasings elsewhere) suggests that, on his view, subjects stand in a relation of acquaintance, or something along those lines, to these virtual objects. But, as standing in a relation to X implies that X exists, that would be a sense datum way of thinking of virtual objects. For it would be to reify appearances, as it used to be put, and reified appearances are sense data. Like any one-time sense datum theorist, I feel the intuitive appeal of this way of approaching matters but, as Levine himself remarks early in the volume (p. 4), sense data are "metaphysically extravagant". Moreover, there is a famous objection to the reification of appearances when it is put forward as a way of handling the phenomenal character of conscious experience. Indeterminacy is part of the phenomenal character of experience. For example, when trees look to be a certain distance from you, they do not look to be some exact distance from you, and when trees look to have many leaves, they do not look to have some exact number of leaves. But what exists is determinate in nature, so an important feature of the phenomenology of perceptual experience cannot be captured by the properties of what's reified. (For those who believe in de re vagueness, the objection can be put by noting that any degree of indeterminacy in nature is much less than the indeterminacy in how things look to be).

The obvious way out is to think of virtual objects in the way many representationalists think of so-called intentional objects. For these representationalists, the (only) sense in which an intentional object with such and such a nature exists is that in order for things to be as they are being represented to be, there needs to be an object of such and such a nature. In this sense, a belief in the devil is about the devil. Although the devil does not exist, the belief represents that things are a certain way, and were things that way the devil (or maybe we should say, an item with devil-like properties) would exist.

Levine will resist this suggestion. At a number of points, he discusses representationalist treatments of the phenomenal nature of mental states and finds them interesting but wanting. I will close with a discussion of why he finds them wanting and take the liberty of suggesting a way out.

Levine treats representationalist treatments of experience with considerable respect. My sense is that the reason is, first, that he (rightly) finds transparency intuitively attractive and representationalism is the non-sense datum way of giving transparency its due; and, second, the appeal of the thesis that changes in intentional content go hand in hand with changes in qualitative character. His core case against representationalism turns on the thought that any viable version must be an externalist one, and there's an epistemic problem with externalist versions. The epistemic problem is the familiar one sometimes put by noting that whether you are on Earth or Twin Earth may be inaccessible to you in a way in which the phenomenal natures of your experiences are not. There is a lot to say about this worry. Levine discusses, as you would expect, the debate between Ned Block and Michael Tye over Inverted Earth, and Tyler Burge's response to skeptical worries about externalism (see ch. 4 especially). However, there is an externalist version of representationalism that finesses this debate. Let me spell this out quickly.

In the Heller Illusion, two vertical lines that are in fact straight look curved. When you are asked to confirm that they look curved, you look at the diagram and most especially at the two lines in the diagram. Where else should you look? And you seem to be describing the way something before you is. That's one way to put transparency. Representationalists explain this by holding that perceptual experiences represent that things are thus and so, and what is happening in this example is that your perception represents that the lines are curved. The curviness lies, so to speak, in how things are being represented to be, not in something's being curved, be it called a sense datum, an appearance, a virtual object you are acquainted with, or whatever.

There are many questions that might and have been asked about this popular idea. An obvious one is how an experience gets the representational content it has, and it is plausible that a broadly externalist answer is called for. There are two reasons why this is so plausible. One lies in the appeal of broadly causal approaches to representation. Somehow or other, a state of yours gets to represent that things are thus and so in front of you by virtue of the obtaining of a complex story that includes, somewhere or other, the state's causal connections to being thus and so. The other lies in a point about truth conditions. Suppose we have two people in different places, identical from the skin in, each having a visual experience that represents that things are thus and so in front of them. They will utter the same words to describe their experiences in response to any given input (that follows from their internal identity), nevertheless, the conditions under which their experiences are veridical differ. This is because the regions in front of them are differently located. It follows that the truth conditions for their experiential states differ (with an important qualification to be mentioned shortly).

I think, in much company including, I take it, Levine's, that these two considerations are decisive. However, and I think this is the possibility Levine overlooks, there is a version of externalism that means that persons identical from the skin in are identical in how they represent things to be. This version grants that subjects' causal interactions with surroundings play a key role in determining how their states represent how things around them are, but holds that actual and possible interactions count equally. That a state would be caused by such and such counts equally with the fact that the state is caused by such and such, for instance. On this version of externalist representationalism, subjects identical from the skin in are alike in how they represent things to be. This is because different subjects identical from the skin in are alike in how they would interact with any given input, while differing of course in which inputs they actually interact with.

What about truth conditions? The obvious way to think about the representational or intentional content of experiences -- and this applies to representationalism in general, not just the version just sketched -- is as relating to how things are relative to the subject having the experience. When you see things, you see them as being so and so, located thus and so relative to yourself. When you hear things, you hear them as located thus and so relative to yourself. And so on. If this is right, the proper way to think of the truth conditions of a perceptual experience is in terms of a function that goes from a subject to truth just if things are the right way relative to the subject. In this sense, the perceptions of differently located subjects can be alike in truth conditions. That's the important qualification heralded above.


Levine, J. 1983. "Materialism and Qualia: The Explanatory Gap", Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 64: 354 -- 361.

Levine, J. 2001. Purple Haze: The Puzzle of Consciousness, New York: Oxford University Press.