Spinoza's Ethics stands as something like a geometrical monolith promising philosophical truth that is cold, hard, and unchanging. It is written with such unflinching confidence that when readers note that 2p13 doesn't quite fit with 5p23, or that 5p35 runs up against 3p13s, they suspect the problem is with themselves and not with Spinoza's timeless vision. The austere style of the work, with its invocation of Euclid's unchanging realm, leads us to think that any adequate interpretation must meet the challenge of making everything in it come out as true all at once.
The central aim of Eugene Garver's book is to challenge this view of the Ethics as an unchanging monolith. "I read the Ethics as a drama with a complex plot, complete with reversals and discoveries" (12), he writes, with the chief discovery being that "its readers can progress, [and] move from being the subjects of the geometric method to being its practitioners" (13). It is, in short, a sort of Bildungsroman of some philosophical initiate, giving an account of the transformation from a fractured life to an enlightened one. The transformation is achieved, in Garver's view, through the cunning of the imagination, in something like the way that Hegel's reason uses the accidents of history to lure us into progressively enlightened states. In such a reading, not everything Spinoza writes needs to be true at once. As the Ethics proceeds, we learn, we shift, we reverse, and we see more deeply into what is required to gain self-knowledge; and if we are very dedicated to the task, we might transcend the geometrical style itself and achieve that knowledge for ourselves.
This reading strategy would be a disappointing hermeneutic cop-out if Garver merely waved it like a magic wand in the face of every textual difficulty, but his discussion is far richer and more strategic. The general plot of the Ethics, on his account, is that our understanding begins with a sharp bifurcation between the particular truths revealed by our imaginative faculties and the universal truths apprehended by our intellect. At the beginning, adequate ideas can do nothing for us, since they have no connection to the particularity of our bodies or their circumstances. They do not speak our language of finitude, and they are as useless to us as textbooks are to Neanderthals. As embodied beings, we are at the mercy of the pushes and pulls of the world; until, that is, we become political, and we begin to shape our preferences and behaviors to coordinate with those of others, and particularly with those of a sovereign. Then we begin to see ourselves and our responsibilities in increasingly general terms, and we begin to gain adequate ideas that are practical and useful. Eventually we can see ourselves as belonging to an intellectual community, and finally as belonging to a divine substance. And this, finally, is how that initial bifurcation of truths is bridged.
This developmental plotline is the key to Garver's interpretive renegotiations among the parts of the Ethics that otherwise bang harshly into one another. Each conflict or tension is resolved in the light of the development of "the main character" from one insight to the next. "This is not the geometric method as a series of inferences that a computer could carry out," Garver writes, "but the confrontation with and overcoming of one difficulty after another as the argument moves from God to human freedom" (163).
Garver's book is split into two parts, each consisting of four chapters. The first part lays out the metaphysical divide within Spinoza's reality, with God and infinite modes and adequate ideas resting on one side, and finite things and imagination and inadequate ideas on the other. (Garver follows Eugene Marshall and others in identifying Spinoza's infinite modes with adequate ideas, which will be jarring to many other commentators.) It would seem, from this first part, that human beings will never get anywhere their imaginations can't take them. Specifically, it is striking that Spinoza (at first) offers no grounds for thinking that humans will have any attraction at all toward knowledge, or indeed toward anything that doesn't yield immediate bodily pleasure. The second part begins in akrasia, as the human inquirer begins to gain knowledge without being able to act on it. As the imagination becomes more sophisticated, discovering pleasures that draw upon culture and other people, we undergo a "bootstrapping" sort of ascension into more mindful ways of being, landing finally in a spot where we recognize that in order to gain self-knowledge, we shall have to transcend the geometrical method and work in our own ways to know ourselves as adequate causes. That is when we will know ourselves to be eternal. In Garver's own pithy summary, "The Ethics moves from bootstrap empowerment through bootstrap sociability finally to bootstrap immortality" (254).
A crucial transition in Garver's interpretation comes at 4p59: "To every action to which we are determined from an affect which is a passion, we can be determined by reason, without that affect". We can now perhaps anticipate why this proposition should be so important: this is where the intellectual rubber meets the imaginative road, so to speak. As Garver puts it, Spinoza has two needles to thread by the time he comes to this proposition. He needs to show how people can become adequate causes of their actions without necessarily becoming adequate causes of their own existence. Secondly, he needs to show that there is room in our minds and bodies for adequate ideas alongside inadequate ideas and passive emotions. Garver's lengthy discussion of this one proposition is rich and nuanced, as he uses 4p59 as a fulcrum for balancing the two worlds Spinoza is committed to and also as a turning point at which narrow imaginative urgings give way to enlightened engagement with the world:
as a passive pleasure involves a greater and greater proportion of the whole mind and body, it approaches an adequate idea. In this way, we are back into being an adequate cause, and therefore having adequate ideas. Pleasures and increases in power can approximate the whole, as a backdoor way of approaching the infinite. The key idea here is that an idea becomes infinite by becoming the right kind of whole, not by getting ever bigger. (219)
Again, in keeping with the central idea of Garver's approach, Spinoza could not have expected his readers to generate this proposition just from the axioms and definitions of parts 1 through 4. The reader is expected to develop step by step through the course of the Ethics, and eventually reach a point at which something like 4p59 is required for advancing any further. At that point, the reader will be willing to reconsider and reject any previous proposition that suggested that actions and passions should never overlap. In recounting this sort of developmental story, Garver pays close attention to what propositions are invoked in the demonstrations. When a proposition could have been proven earlier but wasn't, he naturally explores why it wasn't, or why Spinoza brought that proposition forward later rather than sooner. Over its extended application, Garver's approach becomes increasingly plausible: Spinoza is not just pounding out proof after proof, but is instead patiently cultivating our sensibilities along the way so that we might be led toward more fruitful insights.
Spinoza, more than any of our other Great Dead Philosophers, attracts all kinds of people who become deeply enthralled by the Ethics and labor in its shadow before finally offering their own measure of the work. This paradigm partly fits Garver, who comes to Spinoza from a highly distinguished career as a scholar of Aristotle. Garver writes that he has been working toward this book for a dozen years, and his enchantment with Spinoza is evident. The view he has constructed is clearly something he has developed through long meditation upon Spinoza's works, and the body of his text is largely free from complicated engagements with other scholars. His notes however show that he has paid close attention to a broad swath of the secondary literature, and he is especially careful to note and quote when his views align with others' work. Throughout his book, he presses Spinoza's text with good and difficult questions, and explores them in ways that are not merely technical or textual, but refreshingly human and gripping to anyone trying to gain deep philosophical insight from the Ethics.
This is an excellent book, especially for those in need of a fresh approach to a well-trodden text. I have read it twice, and still haven't finished reading it. The sorts of questions Garver raises, the problems he uncovers, and the assumptions he rejects all breathe new life into the Ethics. Garver's interpretation is impressively novel and philosophically fruitful, and is in its own way cunningly imaginative.