2019.07.13

Scott Soames

The Analytic Tradition in Philosophy, Volume 2: A New Vision

Scott Soames, The Analytic Tradition in Philosophy, Volume 2: A New Vision, Princeton University Press, 2018, 423pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691160030.

Reviewed by Gregory Landini, University of Iowa


This volume continues the history of analytic philosophy of Volume 1 (2014). A few of the chapters (p. viii) are explained as updated and substantially expanded parts of his two-volume Philosophical Analysis in the Twentieth Century (2003). Almost everything in it is wonderfully engaging and controversial as is expected of important works on the history of philosophical ideas. Since we are entering in the second volume of Scott Soames's account, a short prologue coming from a revisionist Russell scholar may help orient the discussion.

It is not often appreciated that in The Problems of Philosophy (1912), Russell accepted synthetic a priori knowledge in logic, mathematics, probability and ethics. Its sequel, dropping ethics from the list (since, unlike the others, its purported unique necessity couldn't, he thought, be subsumed into logic) was his 1914 Scientific Method in Philosophy (aka: Our Knowledge of the External World as a Field for Scientific Method in Philosophy) which held that logic (i.e., the logic of Whitehead and Russell's Principia Mathematica) is the essence of this new research program of scientific philosophy. The program endeavored to undermine indispensability arguments for abstract particulars and allegedly unique kinds of necessity (arithmetic, geometric, causal, biological, etc.) conjured up by the "muddled" (Russell's word) traditional metaphysicians. Principia showed the way in mathematics, advocating a uniquely (non-Fregean) revolutionary Logicist thesis that there are no abstract particulars (numbers, classes, functions, infinitesimals, propositions) and no special kinds of necessity (arithmetic, geometric) in any branch of mathematics. It holds that mathematicians, especially the Cantorians, have newly discovered that they are studying relations when they do mathematics. Principia's logic of relations is synthetic a priori because of its comprehension principles *12.1.11, etc., i.e.

(∃θn)∀x1, . . . , ∀xn)n!(x1, . . . , xn)  θ(x1, . . . , xn)),

where the predicate variable θn! is not free in the wff θ and the language is simple-type stratified. Relations in intension are not abstract particulars and thus perfectly consistent with the revolutionary mathematicians. (Fregean logicism rejected the revolution, adhering to a metaphysics of numbers as logically necessary abstract particulars. Every advocate of a set/class-theory, e.g., Zermelo, Quine, Gödel, etc., must also reject the revolution against abstract particulars.)

Russell's program originates with his 1911 paper "Analytic Realism" with which Wittgenstein was originally an ally in holding that the only necessity/possibility is logical (TLP 6.37; 6375). But Russell admitted that the epistemology for his scientific method, which he had hoped to set out in his 1913 Theory of Knowledge, reached an impasse concerning how it avoids its own metaphysical commitments to abstract particulars -- namely, logical forms acquaintance with which ground our understanding of 'identity', 'all', 'some', 'and, ' 'or' and 'not'. In his 1914 book, Russell remarks that Wittgenstein was working on transcending this impasse. Wittgenstein's 1921 Tractatus, however, adopted a Doctrine of Showing which seems to throw out the baby with the bathwater -- rejecting comprehension, demanding the decidability of logic, abandoning Cantor's work on the transfinite, and developing logic and arithmetic from recursive operations.

Soames opens with the following striking view which is central to the entire book and merits careful study (Preface p. ix):

Although aspects of their emerging paradigm -- particularly Russell's logicized version of it -- were new, the conception of philosophy it served was not. The aim was to use the new analytic means to solve traditional problems of ethics, epistemology and metaphysics. That changes with the publication of Wittgenstein's Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus in 1922, its assimilation by the early Vienna Circle of Schlick, Carnap and Hahn in the 1920's, the flowering of logical empiricism in the 1930's. . . . analysis wasn't a philosophical tool; it was philosophy. Analysis wasn't (officially) in the service of advancing theories or developing philosophical world views, which, according to the new orthodoxy, must inevitably exceed the limits of intelligibility.

The view seems supported by a nice quote from Schick (p. 163). But there may well be a misunderstanding here. It certainly was not Wittgenstein's ouroboric showing/elucidation program against advancing theories that influenced subsequent decades of logical empiricism. Schlick may have meant only to endorse a point he thought echoed in the Tractatus, namely that there can be no scientific metaphysical ontology of abstract particulars and special non-logical kinds of necessity. That was also the point in Russell's paper "Analytic Realism." Soames is quite correct that the chief purpose of the early and mid-century research program of "analytic philosophy" in the hands of the logical empiricists is aptly described as "The Scientific Conception of the World," designed to formalize, systematize, and unify [empirical] science. But Soames goes too far in imagining that the Tractatus convinced those impressed by it to adopt its oracular insinuation that philosophy is not a genuine science (body of truths) at all, but is a practice of showing/elucidating all and only what is Sinnlos (mathematical logic and ethics and semantics) and adamantly ignoring the Unsinnig.

Soames doesn't focus his discussion on showing. If he had, he might have come to agree that no one who admired the Tractatus accepted showing! Ayer observed: "What is quite unacceptable is that one and the same series of pronouncements should be both devoid of sense and unassailably true." The Tractatus ends with TLP 7: Whereof one cannot speak, thereof one must be silent. Ramsey quipped: "What we can't say we can't say, and we can't whistle it either." [1] In lampooning the Tractarian notion, Gellner's Words and Things (1959) retorts "Whereof one insinuates, thereof one must speak." In fact, quite a lot of whistling occurs in the Tractatus. Concerning its story of arithmetic as a practice of showing the sameness of outcomes of operations (= recursive functions) characterized with numeral exponents, Ramsey wrote that it is "faced with insuperable difficulties" (Fnd of Math 1926). The N-operator of the Tractatus intended to implement showing by holding that quantification theory with identity (where admissible) is a decidable practice of calculation that realizes TLP 5.141, the result that all and only logical equivalents have one and the same representation. With Church's undecidability result (1936), showing is dead, and without conventionalism as its replacement, scientific method in philosophy returned as a genuine science offering theories, as Russell had, that enable the rejection of abstract particulars and non-logical necessities in the sciences (including logic itself).

Carnap rejected showing as vehemently as Ramsey before him. He wrote: "he [Wittgenstein] seems to me to be inconsistent in what he does. He tells us that one cannot make philosophical statements, and that whereof one cannot speak, thereof one must be silent; and then instead of keeping silent, he writes a whole philosophical book."[2] When (as Soames nicely recounts on p. 328) verificationism died in the late 1930's from Duheim's revelations about confirmation holism (with Ayer admitting defeat in the 1940's from Church's refutation of his last best formulation), Carnap came to imagine that his thesis of the meaninglessness of philosophical ontology (abstract particulars, kinds of non-logical necessity) might be newly sustained by invoking a distinction between "internal-questions" (well-formed in a linguistic framework for science) versus practical matters ("external questions") as to whether to adopt a given linguistic framework. Soames insightfully points out that Quine destroyed Carnap's conventionalism. But it is also worth noting that Carnap's conventionalism cannot sustain a principled distinction between those pseudo-predicates he wants eliminated in favor of conventions of linguistic forms -- pseudo-predicates belonging to meaningless philosophical ontology (e.g., "exist", "number", "physical object", "universal", "class") -- and those genuine predicates ("prime number," "electron," "temperature", "force") that are properly admitted in science.

Soames imagines a "Frege-Russell logicist vision of mathematics" that offered a new logic that was adopted in cause of empiricist and verificationist reduction (pp. 112, 160). There is no such vision and no such logic. Russell's agenda was to free every branch of mathematics from abstract particulars (numbers, classes, geometric spatial entities, etc.). Frege never wavered in his belief that numbers are abstract particulars. The "new logic" used for the empiricist reduction was little more than quantification theory with identity. Soames (p. 164) would be right to indict Carnap for calling his conventionalism "logicist" in either Frege or Russell's sense, for logical empiricism has no patience at all for comprehension in logic. No empiricist can accept comprehension in logic, for it makes logic synthetic a priori.

Soames (p. 164) conflates the paradox of the Russell property (that an entity has when it is a property that doesn't exemplify itself) with the semantic equivocation on "denotes" that animated Grelling's concern about the property of being Heterological (that a predicate expression exemplifies when it denotes a property that the predicate expression does not exemplify). In response to similar paradoxes of Richard, Berry and König/Dixon, 1906 found Russell pointing out (following Peano) that "denotes" has to be tied to the resources of a given language L, and this readily dispatches these pseudo-paradoxes as equivocations. It is also disappointing to find (p. 164) that (∃R2)(∀x)(R2xx  ~θxx) is said to be "unparadoxically true in textbook second order logic no matter how the predicate θxy is interpreted." Simply interpret it as R2xx and we'll get a contradiction! A valid instance of second-order comprehension requires that "R2" not occur free in the wff θ and indeed that no predicate expression ever occur in a subject position. Russell's paradox of properties is not formulable in the grammar of second order logic.

In chapter 11 (p. 316ff) Soames nicely reminds readers of central bits of Hempel's "The Empiricist Criterion of Meaning" which recounts the saga of the failure of verificationism. After his tour in chapters 8-9 rehearsing Tarski on truth, Gödel on negation incompleteness and Turing computability, we come to see that the thesis Soames is after is most salient in chapters 10-11 which herald the "awakening" of philosophy to metaphysical necessity, knowable a posteriori and a conception of empirical science as if it were its champion instead of the enemy of all essentialisms (especially Aristotelian entelechies and teleological processes). With metaphysical necessity on a pedestal, readers might expect that the last chapters (12-14) on ethics should address whether room can be made for metaphysical necessities in a genuine science of ethics. Soames favors Schlick's scientism (as anticipating evolutionary Ethology) and gives a negative assessment of meta-ethical Emotivism and normative ethics (Pritchard, Ross).

Soames tells a good deal of the history by by first engaging with the Tractatus which he refutes, thereby setting the stage for dispatching logical empiricism in chapters 5-7 which he imagines is tied to the Tractatus. This is overkill. He amply reveals that logical empiricism collapsed all on its own (especially as articulated by Carnap who relied on conventionalism and behaviorism). Soames (p. 302) rightly has no patience for Carnap's de dicto analyses according to which belief is a disposition to assent to a sentence token -- so that e.g., "Peter" in "Charles said (wrote, thought) that Peter was coming tomorrow" does not refer to Peter. Nonetheless, concerns about de re quantification into contexts of belief, necessity, subjunctive conditionals, causation, etc., are not so easily dismissed. Logical necessity (there being no other according to the research program of scientific method in philosophy, whether Russellian, Tractarian, logical empiricist, Quinean or otherwise) is a fundamentally de dicto notion because it is defined as truth in virtue of invariant structure. Quine regarded de re metaphysical necessity as so thoroughly anti-scientific as to be itself committed to an Aristotelian essentialism. Soames accepts de re quantification without ado. But there remain significant philosophical concerns with such de re quantification in spite of the vast efforts in semantics/pragmatics (e.g., rigid designation, externalist epistemology and philosophy of mind, causal theories of reference, meanings are not in the head, essential indexical de se singular thoughts, and the like) that are invoked to make it intelligible.

Soames devotes his first four chapters to the Tractatus, setting it in historical context and revealing its superiority to the logical atomism of Russell's infamous 1918 lectures. It should be noted, however, that Russell's lectures are now known to witness him struggling unsuccessfully to understand ideas from Wittgenstein's 1913 Notes on Logic. In these lectures, Russell experiments with abandoning some of the features of his analytic realism. For example, he abandoned his multiple-relation theory of judgment, abandoned his thesis that there are no general facts and no negative facts as truth-makers, and even abandoned his thesis that universals and logical forms are objects of acquaintance. Thus the superiority the Tractatus enjoys is only a superiority over Russell's confused 1918 interpretation of what he then thought were Wittgenstein's own views. Russell's original analytic realism (scientific method in philosophy) and the centrality of Principia's logic goes unevaluated.

Soames focuses on the N-operator of the Tractatus and this is quite laudable. He recognizes that the N-operator is, in fact, central to the implementation the Tractarian fundamental idea -- its doctrine of showing -- as it pertains to logic, mathematics, ethics, necessity, truth, and semantics. The four chapters he offers on Wittgenstein, therefore, largely stand or fall with his account of the N-operator. In one very insightful passage Soames recognizes that the N-operator expression allows not only the one-place Np, but also N(p, q), N(p, q, r), and so on for any finite number of places (p. 56). Yet almost in the very same breadth he remarks that "Wittgenstein had a single operator N for joint negation" (also called "joint denial" on p. 57). This may be a slip. Sheffer's joint denial expression "p↓q" (for which "↓(p,q)" is a notational variant) is dyadic. The dagger sign "↓" is not an operator sign at all but is flanked by wffs to form a wff. Operator (i.e., recursive function) signs, e.g., √n, n2, m+n, etc, are flanked by one or more terms to form a term. The difference is not incidental. Recent interpretations construe "N(p,q)", "N(p, q, r)", etc., as terms that are literally pictures akin to Venn diagrams which implement showing by picturing truth-conditions so that all and only the logical equivalents of quantification with identity (where admissible) have one and the same expression: We find:

TLP 5.141
If p follows from q and q follows from p then they are one and the same proposition.

Soames quotes this very passage. But then he mistakenly attributes to Wittgenstein a thesis that he embeds in the following title for the subsection of chapter 3: "The Second Fundamental Misstep: Identifying Equivalent Propositions" (p. 49). A look at the Tractatus reveals that the phrase "follows from" in 5.141 is elliptical for "logically/necessarily follows from." Curiously, Soames himself goes on to inadvertently correct this slip when later he praises Wittgenstein for "semantic breakthroughs" which were eclipsed by an unfortunate "identification of necessarily equivalent propositions" (p. 103).

In 1983, Soames offered an important interpretative effort (as Geach had before him in a different way) to modify the N-notation so that it could have a chance at being expressively adequate to quantification theory. Soames adds hard brackets [ . . . ] for scope (p. 59) and notations such as N(N(x[N(Fx)]) to express ~∀xFx. He surely recognized that his notational modifications are never found in any of Wittgenstein's writings. But as we progress through the chapters, the idea Soames introduced somehow became Wittgenstein's own. Perhaps Soames imagined that if the historical Wittgenstein was not inept, the N-operation must have been what he says it is. Fogelin and Geach concluded (with regret) that the historical Wittgenstein was indeed inept since his N notations cannot express mixed multiply general wffs such as " (∃y)(∀x)Rxy" which require confining the scope of one quantifier differently from another subordinate to it. That was the state of scholarship in 1983, but it is now 2019. There are new interpretations. In a passage from 22 May 1915 (Wittgenstein's Notebooks 1914-1916, p. 49) one finds:

The mathematical notation "  1 +x/1! + x2/2!+ . . . " together with the dots is an example of that extended generality. A law is given and the terms that are written down serve as an illustration. In this way instead of (x)fx one might write "fx • fy . . . "

Similar passages from 1915/16 explicitly tie the notion of "operation" to his notion of the dots (aka: "and so on") rendering a recipe (e.g., recursive characterization) and an illustration of the general form which produces a series by successive (albeit perhaps not consecutive) application. This anticipates the ξ notation of TLP 5.50 and TLP 6 where N(p, ξ, N(ξ)) is given as the general form of a truth-functional operation. Over an arbitrarily large n-element domain, where the variables x1, . . . , xn are all exclusive of one another, no scope confining brackets are needed. Mixed multiply general wffs are readily accommodated -- over any arbitrary finite bound n.

And we get the following:

~(∀x)Fx i.e., ~(Fx1 • . . . • Fxn)

is pictured as NN(NFx1, . . . , NFxn).

The is just the same as (∃x)~Fx. Observe as well that we have:

(∀x)~Fx i.e., (~Fx1 • . . . • ~Fxn)

is pictured as N (NNFx1, . . . , NNFxn)

~ (∃x) Fx i.e., ~ (Fx1 ∨ . . . ∨Fxn)

is pictured as NNN(Fx1, . . . , Fxn).

Since Wittgenstein holds that NNp = p, the notation realizes his goal at TLP 5.141 of a notation where these have the same picture in N-notation.

The interpretations of the N-operator offered by Soames, Fogelin, and Geach do not even attempt to realize TLP 5.141 according to which logical equivalence have the same N-notation. The new interpretation does. It appeals to Wittgenstein's view that the calculation of outcomes of N-operation (just as calculation of outcomes of equations) are conducted by rules of sameness.

Consider also these logical equivalents:

(∀x)(Fx • Gx) i.e., (Fx1 • Gx1) • . . . • (Fxn • Gxn)

is pictured as N(NFx1, NGx1, . . . , NFxn, NGxn)

(∀x)(Fx) • (∀x)Gx i.e., (Fx1 · Fxn) • . . . • (Gx1 • Gxn)

is pictured as N(NFx1, . . . , NFxn, NGx1, . . . , NGxn).

These are the same since the rule asserts that the order doesn't matter. Soames actually cites the very entry (TLP 5.501) stating the order doesn't matter (p. 58).

Contrary to Soames, Geach, and Fogelin, with no alteration of the Tractarian notation at all, N-notations are expressively adequate for any arbitrarily large finite n. But, of course, Fogelin is right that the N-operator (i.e., its method of calculation) fails to realize Wittgenstein's demand for a decision procedure for quantification-theory with identity (where legitimate).

Since there are no classes or other ens non gratis that Soames brings in to modify N-notation, the flaws he inveighs (e.g., p. 65ff) against Wittgenstein's N-operator apply only to his own interpretation. Insightfully, he does remark that "if there are only finitely many tractarian objects (metaphysical simples), then no quantifiers or symbols for generality are strictly required because every tractarian proposition will be a truth function of finitely many elementary propositions" (p. 65). But Soames misses Wittgenstein's use of "and so on", i.e., the import of the x notation and the use of a schematic "n" for any natural number to show (potential) infinity. And with the intrusion of proper names and puzzles about substitution of identicals, Soames endeavors to excoriate Wittgenstein's elimination of identity (p.75ff). The invectives Soames brings against Wittgenstein's efforts at showing identity and infinity miss their target by failing to incorporate the elimination of identity into the N-operator notion itself. Only with such an incorporation can one hope to explain TLP 5.535 according to which the necessary infinity of logical simples is shown (not said) by the potential infinity of the exclusive quantifiers themselves.

To his credit, Soames takes up the very important question of whether N-notations could somehow emulate "second-order quantification," i.e., the binding of predicate variables. Better put, the very important question is whether the Tractatus has the resources to emulate quantification binding function (operator) variables. It would certainly seem that Wittgenstein thought so, for as Ramsey noted, he has to emulate "(∃n)( 2+n = 5)" by his recursive operations characterized with the help of numeral exponents. So the answer should be 'yes' and not 'no' as Soames concludes. But however one thinks about it, no quantification theory embodies comprehension. In his investigation, Soames inappropriately imagines (p. 70) that Wittgenstein would accept material relations R3 and R2 logically related as follows:

(x, y, z)(R3(x, y, z)  (Px • Py • ~Pz))

(x, y, z)(R2(x, y, z)  (Px • Py)).

Wittgenstein flatly rejected comprehension in logic. Genuine (material) relations, there being no others, are those postulated in empirical science. And the existence of one fact in which a material relation inheres never logically entails anything about the existence of any other. The current state of scholarship, not mentioned by Soames, takes logic and arithmetic of operations in the Tractatus to anticipate a combinatorial logic/arithmetic. There is, nonetheless, much to be learned from the endeavors Soames makes to decipher the Tractatus. They may be love's labor's lost. But so also have been (and will often continue to be) the important labors of all who try.

In his subsequent chapters, Soames marshals a full attack against attempts in the twentieth-century to define (or analyze away) necessity -- including logical necessity truth. He offers an engaging story of the origins of some of the now passé philosophical dalliances with conventionalism in logic and physics that occurred as the world grappled with the discovery of rival formal deductive systems, model theoretic semantics, and Einstein's revolutionary new physics which dared to make distinctly physical notions of mass and acceleration components of its so-called "physical geometry." Soames describes logical empiricists as embracing "the rejection of geometry as the abstract a priori study of physical space" (p. 112). Certainly, empiricism rejects geometry as a synthetic a priori study. Geometry, Whitehead held, is synthetic a priori -- a study of the pure mathematics of relations (projections, transformations, etc.), while physics remains knowable only a posteriori -- although it may, partly, depend on applying the solutions to philosophical conundrums concerning the nature and physical meaning of the measurement of magnitudes. Whitehead, it seems, never got over Einstein's revolutionary gravitational physical geometry, since it is not a case of an applying a coordinate free mathematical geometry; and he left Principia's fourth volume on geometry unfinished, launching instead into his methods of extensive abstraction and offering a rival physics of universal relatedness.

In chapter 10, Soames makes a valiant effort to dissociate the concept of necessity from the concepts analytic and a priori. But the discussion forgets that it was by definition that logical empiricists took "analytic" statements to be those that are invariantly true in virtue of the meaning of just the logical words of a quantification theory. Carnap's empiricism floundered (as Quine pointed out) because no behaviorist theory of sharable meaning in communication (no other being viable) can sustain that definition while marking a distinction in kind with what is synthetic. With conventionalism refuted, Carnap's invariance conception of necessity is in trouble for it has no means to choose which structures establish the "logical" structures that are to be invariant. Frege's logicist notion of "analytic" (tailored to accommodate comprehension of functions in logic) has no connection to empirical meaning at all. Contrary to Soames (p. 298), Wittgenstein's Tractatus (TLP 6.1231; 5.525), in its efforts to show arithmetic and logic in recursive functions, vehemently objected to any characterization of necessity (and possibility) in terms of invariance. Russell's position was more nuanced: while logical necessity is grounded in facts of universals and is not an invariance notion, logically necessary truth most certainly is. (In fact, a recursive definition of "truth" anticipating Tarski appears in the informal Introduction to Principia). For Russell, comprehension in logic makes it a science about structure. Its truths are not true in virtue of their structure.

Having rejected comprehension principles in logic and having dismissed Russell's Problems of Philosophy (which appealed to acquaintance with universals as the epistemic foundation of synthetic a priori knowledge) logical empiricists thought they had only to explain our a priori knowledge of the logically true statements of quantification theory with identity (other "analytic" statements such as "All bachelors are unmarried" being transformable by substitution of synonyms). With Tarski's ingenious notion of a denumerable sequence satisfying a wff, the task of defining invariant truth (logical necessity = logical truth = invariant truth in every interpretation over any non-empty size domain) was accomplished. But the problem of which words are the "logical" words remained. Soames astutely remarks that Quine undermined the conventionalism (pp. 301, 307) about the logical connectives that was involved in the logical empiricist account of necessary (truth) as invariant truth. But one may worry that Soames is mistaken in holding that Quine's alliance with Dewey's holistic form of behaviorism was inessential to whatever success "Two Dogmas of Empiricism" had in undermining the existence of a distinction in kind (accepted by both Rationalist and traditional Empiricists alike) between the notion of analytic and synthetic. Quine himself praised Dewey's naturalism and his thesis that "meaning is not a psychic existence; it is primarily a property of behavior." Indeed, Soames offers little that explains the intimate connections between Quine's attack on the dogmas, his holistic web of belief (which puts mathematics and logic on a par with empirical matters in physics), and his startling theses of the indeterminacy of translation and of ontological relativity.

Unlike Davidson, who exalts a Tarski-inspired definition of truth as though it were all there is to a theory of interpretation (and meaning), Soames wisely holds that Tarski's recursive definition of true-satisfaction-in-L, for formal language L, cannot do justice to the notion of truth. Its correct value lies only in that it facilitates the very important science of model theory for formal languages L and enables a study of formal systems and the question of their semantic completeness (pp. 269ff, 287). But oddly, he resists making the same conclusion about possible world semantics for formal languages for alethic modalities. Though it is nowhere made explicit in the book, the likely reason is the allegiance Soames has to the new dogma of philosophical scientism according to which the only necessity is metaphysical necessity and it is knowable a posteriori. But characterizations of necessity/possibility in terms of invariance over metaphysically possible worlds cannot do justice to the many complicated notions of necessity. Wittgenstein and the logical empiricists followed in the footsteps of Russell in holding that the many different meanings of "necessity" generate a jumble of confusion which scientific method in philosophy endeavors to sort out. It remains a jumble of philosophical confusions to this day.

Soames's book will very much reward its readers with its valuable interpretation of the involuted history that philosophy has gone through in its efforts to understand the natures and kinds of necessity that there are.


[1] Frank Ramsey, “General Propositions and Causality,” in The Foundations of Mathematics, ed., R. B. Braithwaite (London: Harcourt, Brace and Co., 1931), p. 238.

[2] Rudolf Carnap, Philosophy and Logical Syntax (London: Kegan Paul, 1935).