This book is a very well researched, clearly written, and thought-provoking examination of what the internal structure of physically extended bodies was thought to be by Western scientists and philosophers in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries. It interweaves historical and logical analyses, from the first to the last page, in a complex pattern in which the property of the divisibility of matter is taken to be the most dominant, if not the exclusive, defining character of matter. This would be quite understandable if the essence of matter is taken to be extension, but the author does not make that point explicitly. Because of the author’s interpretive perspective the book has the virtue of viewing the origins of modern science from an ontological perspective, which raises for us again many of the initial metaphysical issues which have been at the foundations of Greek philosophy from the beginning.
Holden’s methodology needs to be appreciated by the reader as a first step. Although the book is an important contribution to the history of science, the discussion is organized topically, not chronologically, around the various arguments and disputes that arose among the founders of modern science. After carefully gathering, quoting, and analyzing the key passages from the writers of the period on these topics, Holden identifies the views which were widely held, or which had major later impact, or which were especially creative. Then as a philosopher he employs the tools of logical reconstruction to formulate and to critically evaluate the formal arguments which result. This has the advantage of focusing sharply on the logical analysis of these arguments, at the price of some disadvantages at times of disassociating an historical author’s views from other components of his thought that could provide greater contextual understanding. On the other hand Holden helpfully and carefully identifies the specific authors who advocate (or reject) the idealized arguments under evaluation. In almost all cases he concludes that the reconstructed arguments are invalid, mostly for begging the question.
The author’s main thesis, repeated often in this book, is that the classical paradoxes which arise from the notion of infinite divisibility in the physical world are not primarily mathematical in character, but are due to the attendant ontological claims made about physical objects. To carry out his project Holden distinguishes carefully between various senses of “divisibility”: physical, metaphysical, formal, and intellectual. Metaphysical divisibility, the key to his analysis, is defined as follows: “An extended entity is metaphysically divisible (hereafter m-divisible) if and only if it is logically possible that its spatially distinct parts could exist separately from one another.” (p.12) “Logical possibility” is then doubly specified further for the time period of this book as “conceivability” and as “what can be done by divine omnipotence.” It should be noted that for Holden these two specifications seem to mean that “ontology” and “metaphysics” are used in the contemporary sense of “possible world ontology,” rather than in the sense of the “way things actually are in themselves,” which is closer to the meaning accorded the terms in the Seventeenth and Eighteenth centuries by both their defenders and opponents.
To use our own example, was Descartes thinking of a possible world or the real world when he said that the amount of matter and motion created by God could not ever be increased or decreased, even by God Himself, because He is immutable and He got it right the first time (which, by the way, was the early original suggestion of what were to be later called the laws of the conservation of mass and momentum)? Furthermore Holden’s standard of metaphysical divisibility can be difficult to apply. For how does one know precisely what is inconceivable or logically impossible (parallel lines which meet — meanings vary contextually over time), or what is within the power of God (human life without the body on which it seems essentially to depend)? At any rate this type of divisibility is not geometrical but ontological (in whichever sense), and the author’s goal is to show that the classical paradoxes of infinite divisibility have their impact at the metaphysical level as defined, even though it is limited in Holden’s definition to the spatially distinct parts of an extended body as existing separately from one another.
One other major distinction runs through the book as the paradoxes are formulated. If a body is divisible, what kind of parts does it have? Most of the founding fathers of the modern period (the major exceptions were Hobbes and the later Kant) held that the parts of the whole are actual parts. These parts are actually present in the body before it is divided by some natural or human or divine cause, and as result the act of division does not create them but rather unveils or reveals them. As a result in the strict sense one should not talk about a whole composed of such actual parts as being divisible, since it is already divided before any attempt is made to separate it into parts. Thus also it is not really infinitely divisible, but is already given as actually infinitely divided. If so, is there a determinate number and size of such actual parts? One can see the paradoxes beginning to appear.
Another sense of a “part” of a whole (due originally to Aristotle) is that the parts are potential, that is, they could become actual parts after some division(s) have occurred, but are not actually present beforehand. In this case actual parts are created by division, not merely revealed. In this sense of potential parts, the whole is literally "divisible" (able to be divided, as the etymology of the word indicates.) Also in this case “infinite divisibility” would mean that a body can be divided into as many finitely numerable actual parts one would wish to create, and that process can be continued on into the future indefinitely, as long as one is willing to do so. In this situation no actual infinity of actual parts or divisions is ever produced by natural or human causes (or even by God?). Again conceptual problems are suggested. The author’s claim that his interpretation of the disputes in early modern science on these issues is ontological and not merely mathematical is justified to a great degree by his discussion of actual vs. potential parts which clearly deals with concrete physical bodies, not just geometrical figures.
Holden succeeds very well in showing that these distinctions relating to actual and potential parts were widely modified and adopted by many of the thinkers in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries, and that the actual-parts view was predominant in the period because of its congeniality with corpuscularism and because of its strong opposition to the Aristotelian-Scholastic tradition. With all this in mind a great deal of light is thrown on the disputes in the first two centuries of modern science where the favored, but by no means unanimous, view was a combination of actual parts, infinite divisibility (either successively or all at once), a determinate number of parts, and ultimately atomic parts. Even without Holden’s numerous reconstructions of the logical arguments for combining these various claims, which would take up too much space to present adequately here, one can see even from this brief account that conceptual paradoxes and dilemmas were unavoidable.
He concludes that by the end of the eighteenth century the result was a stalemate between the actual-parts and potential-parts views. But this also has the value of suggesting to us now that a paradigm shift was needed to acquire other categories to conceptualize the problem of the divisibility of matter. This points Holden in the last chapter to a discussion found in the early pre-critical Kant and in Roger Boscovich in the 1750’s of the force-shell atom theory in which the ultimate particles of matter are composed of an unextended point center which radiates a shell of repulsive force which occupies space. As they say the rest is history: of divisible atoms, of quantum field theories, of new geometries, and of new branches of mathematics, especially probability theory. Holden’s analysis of the dilemmas generated over the notion of divisibility in classical modern science clarifies much of what happened later, although the mystery of the fit of mathematics to the physical world still remains.
Holden’s emphasis that his interpretation of the divisibility problem is at the ontological level invites the question of what would the ancients say about this book. Parmenides would argue that if a physical whole is antecedently composed of actual parts, then division is an illusion. For the parts were already there, and nothing changed because of division. So the actual-parts discussion is vacuous. To which Aristotle would say that a physical whole has only potential parts which division actuates. But the advocates of the actual-parts view would say according to Holden that the Aristotelian notion of change as the actualization of what is initially only potential is an unnatural metamorphosis that is mysterious and non-explanatory (pp.117-18). One cannot get something from nothing. But is potency a state of nothingness? If so, then neither the actual-parts nor the potential-parts view can survive. Parmenides and Zeno are smiling. Aristotle of course would insist that potency is neither actuality nor nothingness, but is still a mind-independent component of reality, including matter. And he would add that there are many different types of potency in the architecture of matter besides divisibility, for instance, the dispositions for various actualizations of perhaps density, of inertia, of heat, of elasticity, of optical properties, of magnetism, of shapes, of motions, of temporal properties — all of which were known to belong to matter in the period between Galileo and Kant. The “potential parts” need not be just divisible spatial extensions. It is not clear to this reader why matter is seen so exclusively as spatial extension. In Aristotle’s Physics time presupposes motion, which presupposes physical magnitude, with extension and continuity grounded in magnitude and found again in motion and time in complex ways. If Holden’s analysis had included discussion of the kinetic and temporal dimensions of matter, it would have clarified (and complicated) things considerably. For example, the actual-parts theory then amounts in the last analysis to A. Grunbaum’s block universe where motion and time are non-denumerable dense sets of point entities. Why not matter also? Precisely what is the matter whose architecture is under discussion in this book? Cartesian extension?