This is a brilliant book. It has a number of articles on a wide range of topics in the philosophy of perception. These articles provide overviews of the topics they treat, and many involve original contributions too. It is thus both informative and stimulating.
The book has a substantive introduction by the editor followed by no less than 45 chapters, chunked into seven parts. It has both a name index and a subject index.
Part I Historical Background
Chapter 1 is "Perception in Ancient Greek Philosophy" by Victor Caston -- a thorough discussion of treatments of perception by the presocratics, Plato, and Aristotle. A similarly impressive discussion, but of a different period, comes in Chapter 2 "Perception in Medieval Philosophy" by Dominik Perler. Perler focuses on the Latin philosophers of the late 13th and early 14th centuries.
In Chapter 3, "Skepticism and Perception", Baron Reed covers various sceptical and anti-sceptical themes (linked to perception), from Academic scepticism through Descartes to Moorean anti-scepticism. It's puzzling that Reed doesn't discuss Hume's scepticism with regard to the senses. This falls squarely within the scope of Reed's article and is important enough to warrant discussion in this volume.
In Chapter 4 Alison Simmons offers a superb discussion of "Perception in Early Modern Philosophy". In Chapter 5, Gary Hatfield covers "Perception in Philosophy and Psychology in the 19th and Early 20th Centuries" with characteristic depth, clarity, and application of knowledge of the history of psychology.
Paul Snowdon (Chapter 6, "Sense-Data") discusses different versions of the sense-datum theory, but his main focus is on what he calls "the dominant model" (121). On this model, a sensory experience (and the appearances it involves) consists in a relation of direct awareness to a sense-datum, construed as some sort of mind-dependent entity. Snowdon considers various criticisms of the sense-datum approach, but one interesting strand of his discussion concerns the approach as applied to non-visual experiences. He worries that we have no "coherent model for [the tactile] case" (133), and similarly it is unclear how to make the approach work for olfactory experience (133-134). This aspect of Snowdon's discussion coheres well with various other articles in this volume which rightly encourage us to look beyond visual perception in trying to understand perception.
The final chapter "Phenomenological Approaches", by Charles Siewert, concerns the theorizing about perception we find in Brentano, Husserl, and Merleau-Ponty, and includes a brief section on contemporary work.
Part II Contemporary Philosophical Approaches
Chapter 8 is Bence Nanay's "Perceptual Representation/Perceptual Content". Representationalism, as Nanay understands it, is a view about perceptual states and experiences which holds that they are representational states. His article provides a clear expression of this position, one which usefully clarifies various of its details. Nanay wants to move away from views on which perceptual states are "linguistically or propositionally structured" forms of representation (160). He thus asks "What would then be a general enough way of thinking about mental representations in a manner that is not necessarily propositional?" (160). He spells out the general approach and the application to perception helpfully as follows:
A reasonable suggestion is to think of them [mental representations] as attributing properties to entities. And if we think of mental representations in general as attributing properties to entities, then we should think of perceptual representations as perceptually attributing properties to the perceived scene (160).
The idea is that the representational nature of perceptual states is to be understood in terms of such perceptual representations perceptually attributing properties to perceived scenes. Nanay goes on to clarify exactly what this amounts to by saying more about properties, perceived scenes, and perceptual attribution (160-163).
Though an impressive discussion of representationalism, Nanay's negative discussion of what he regards as alternative positions is less convincing. One example here is the position that Nanay calls "relationalism" (citing as proponents Charles Travis, Bill Brewer, John Campbell, and Michael Martin). Nanay formulates the view as follows:
According to relationalism, perceptual states are, in part, constituted by the actual perceived objects. Perception is a genuine relation between the perceiver and the perceived object -- and not between the agent and some abstract entity called 'perceptual content' (154).
Nanay has various things to say about relationalism, but I'll focus on his suggestion that multimodal perception casts doubt on relationalism. About this he offers the following:
What is the most important for us from this literature is that the multimodality of perception presupposes that information from two different sensory modalities is unified in a shared framework . . . Noise [sound] coming from above and from the left and visual information from the upper-left corner of my visual field are interpreted by the perceptual system as belonging to (or bound to) the same sensory individual . . . This is easy for the representationalist to analyze: vision attributes a property to a part of the perceived scene and audition attributes a different property to the same perceived scene. The two different sense modalities represent the same scene as having different properties . . . To put it very simply, multimodal perception seems to require matching two representations, a visual with the auditory one. If we cannot talk about perceptual representation, how can we talk about what is being matched? The auditory-sense modality gives us a soundscape and vision gives us a visual scene, and our perceptual system puts the two together. It is difficult to explain this without any appeal to representations (157).
And this is supposed to tell against relationalism:
as the relation between the perceiver and the token perceived object that constitutes perception seems to be the outcome of this process of unifying multimodal information our experience of the perceived token object (thus, presumably, the perceptual relation) is brought about by this unification process. The argument from multimodality seems to show that the phenomena anti-representationalists emphasize . . . presuppose the coordination of information in the different sense modalities, but this can only be accounted for in representational terms (158).
The argument here seems to be:
1. Multimodal perception requires the coordination of information in different sensory modalities.
2. Such coordination of information can only be accounted for in representational terms.
3. Therefore, relationalism is false.
I think a relationalist might push back against this in a couple of ways (both of which question the validity of the argument). First, one might question whether the coordination of information and the representational states involved in multimodal perception are constitutive of the resulting multimodal experiences. An alternative is that such information handling, and the representation this involves, is part of what causally enables such experiences to occur. But that's consistent with the constitutive account of such experiences being a relationalist one. Second, some of the relationalists Nanay cites are particularly interested in what constitutes the phenomenal character of perceptual experiences. Suppose the lesson of  and  is that such perceptual experiences have a representational dimension. So representationalism is true. Does that mean that relationalism is false? No. For we have not yet concluded that the phenomenal character of multimodal experiences is constituted by its representational dimension, as opposed to its relational dimension. Representationalism, as Nanay understands it, isn't inconsistent with relationalism about the phenomenal character of genuinely perceptual experiences. For such representationalism just says that perceptual experiences are representational, it doesn't say that their phenomenal character is to be accounted for representationally and non-relationally. (But for further discussion see Nanay 2014).
Chapter 9 is "Perception and the First Person" by Christopher Peacocke. In Chapter 10, "Nonconceptual Content", Wayne Wright provides a helpful overview of the debates and complexities surrounding the issue of whether perceptual experience is somehow dependent on the conceptual resources of perceiving subjects.
Chapter 11 is "Disjunctivism" by Heather Logue. A prominent form of disjunctivism is linked to naive realism. Naive realism, according to Logue, holds that "veridical experience fundamentally consists in the subject bearing the perceptual relation to things in her environment". For instance, "the veridical experience I'm currently having of the yellow, crescent-shaped banana on my desk fundamentally consists in my bearing the perceptual relation to the banana, as well as its yellowness and its crescent shape" (207). But now consider the argument from hallucination, crudely: whatever is fundamentally true of veridical experience, the same must hold for matching total hallucinations. But such hallucinations do not fundamentally consist in perceptual relations to things in the environment. So, we have to reject the naive realist starting point about veridical experience. The naive realist rejects this argument by rejecting the first step. And this is to endorse a form of disjunctivism. As Logue puts it
Naïve Realism is committed to disjunctivism about the metaphysical structure of perceptual experience . . . veridical experience and at least total hallucination have radically different metaphysical structures. Veridical experience fundamentally consists in the subject perceiving things in her environment and certain of their properties, whereas total hallucination fundamentally consists in something else entirely (209).
Naturally, invoking disjunctivism understood in this way gives rise to a question for the naive realist: what naive realist friendly account can be given of hallucination? There is much complicated literature on this. Logue discusses and summarizes it with splendid clarity.
Part II is completed by Chapter 12, Pierre Jacob's "Action-Based Accounts of Perception" and Chapter 13, Berit Brogaard's "Perceptual Reports".
Part III The Senses
David R. Hilbert (Chapter 14, "Vision") discusses various aspects of the science of vision, which leads to a discussion of philosophical questions about vision. In Chapter 15, "Audition", Matthew Nudds provides a brilliant, in-depth discussion of the problem of auditory perception, namely, "to explain, given the character of auditory experience, how we perceive the things that make the sounds we hear" (275). Some will hold that insofar as we experience sound sources at all the sounds we experience are explanatorily prior. But Nudds argues for a different perspective:
This account of how auditory perception functions supports the representational view, according to which auditory perception represents sound sources by representing the sounds they produce. However, it suggests a significant revision to that view. What sounds we experience is a consequence of the way the auditory system transforms the frequency components it detects into a representation of sound-producing events. So the claim that auditory perception represents sound sources by representing the sounds they produce should not be understood as a claim about explanation, that is, that we can explain how we perceive sound sources by appeal to our perception of sounds. The auditory system does not represent sounds that then determine what produced those sounds; it determines what sound producing events there are and that process results in an experience of sounds corresponding to those events. In fact, we saw that sound events cannot be individuated independently of sound-producing events, so there could be no explanation of sound perception other than in terms of the perception of sound-producing events. This reverses the order of explanation implicit in many accounts of auditory perception, and it makes clear that the function of auditory perception -- what auditory perception is for -- is not the perception of sounds, but the perception of the sources of sounds (288-289).
In Chapter 16, "Touch", Frédérique de Vignemont and Olivier Massin defend, among other things, a pressure theory of touch: "Touch is by nature the direct perception of pressure and tension. In other words, pressure is the colour of touch" (298).
Chapter 17 is Barry C. Smith's "The Chemical Senses". Smith's discussion helpfully and convincingly blends scientific and philosophical considerations to argue, against the tradition, that "chemosensory perception puts us in touch with objective features of our environment just as much as the other senses do" (315). A prime example of this comes in the form of flavour perception. As Smith notes, researchers working on flavour and flavour perception have been too quick to go in for some form of subjectivism, with crude ideas like "flavour is in the brain, not the food" (335). In contrast, Smith argues that flavour is
a configuration of the sapid and odorous properties of a substance, including its temperature and texture, as well as its power to irritate the trigeminal nerve. So when speaking about the 'taste' of a food, we are actually speaking about its flavour (341).
Notice that on this conception, the flavour or taste of a banana, say, is not in the brain or subjective. Flavours, like other properties, are objective features of the environment. Not only does Smith's article articulate and motivate this conception of flavour against subjectivist alternatives, he offers a multimodal conception of flavour perception too:
Flavours are perceived when retronasal olfaction and gustation jointly give rise to a fused percept of flavour as a result of multisensory integration at the sub-personal level. We perceive flavours by the mechanisms of olfaction and gustation, under the right conditions, involving touch and at times irritation of the trigeminal nerve (341).
Smith's discussion should be valuable to philosophers and scientists interested in the chemical senses, and should certainly be read by those who are tempted to downgrade chemosensory perception as something that cannot put us in touch with objective features of our environments.
In Chapter 18, "The Bodily Senses", J. Brendan Ritchie and Peter Carruthers discuss interoception, vestibular perception and proprioception. They argue that each "has a strong claim to be considered as (collections of) sensory modalities" (368).
Jesse J. Prinz (Chapter 19, "Unconscious Perception") tries to argue that there is "unconscious transduction of information . . . [in some sense] useable by the organism that transduces it" (373). Is this the same as the issue of whether there is unconscious perception? Unfortunately, Prinz merely (explicitly) stipulates that 'unconscious perception' refers to such unconscious transduction of information (373). So despite his discussion, the reader is left wondering whether there is unconscious perception.
Part IV What We Perceive
In Chapter 20 Roberto Casati discusses "Object Perception". Chapter 21 is "Primary and Secondary Qualities" by Peter Ross. After critical consideration of arguments for thinking of colour as a secondary quality (that is, on Ross's conception, a perceiver dependent quality), Ross concludes that "colour might be as perceiver independent as shape" (417). In Chapter 22, "Colour Perception", Kathleen Akins and Martin Hahn discuss not just colour perception, but the nature of colour and so overlap with Ross's article. Indeed, their conclusion is consonant with Ross's:
the perception of colour as an objective property of the world is no different from the perception of shape or even of a goat. There is no reason to conclude that colour ontology and colour categories are essentially tied to colour experiences, any more than the perceptions of shape or of animals are tied to shape or animal experiences (438).
Chapter 23 is "Perception and Space" by Jérôme Dokic. In this interesting discussion, one of the ideas that Dokic considers is the idea that "perceptual experience essentially involves an egocentric frame of reference, as it constitutively exploits spatial relations to the perceiver's body" (441-442). He argues that "Perceptual egocentricity might well be a myth worth abandoning, at least in some of its influential varieties" (442). Regarding this Dokic might also have considered certain spatial perceptual pathologies the existence of which leads us to question whether perceptual experience essentially involves an egocentric frame of reference. For instance, Bálint's syndrome. A leading researcher describes the visual spatial-perceptual deficit involved in this syndrome as follows:
The space "out there," whether the spatial relationship between one object and another or the spatial relationship between a part of you and the object you see, is no longer available. Somehow your brain is not computing those spaces. There is no there there (Robertson 2004, 6) . . . These patients perceive a single object . . . yet they have no idea where it is located. It is not mislocated. Instead it seems to have no position at all (108).
This doesn't support the general downplaying of egocentricity that Dokic recommends, but it is in line with the idea that egocentric spatial perception is not essential to perceptual experience.
In Chapter 24 Robin Le Poidevin offers an engaging discussion of "Perception and Time". This should be of interest not just to philosophers of perception, but to those interested in the metaphysics of time. For Le Poidevin discusses themes in the philosophy of time perception in relation to ideas in the metaphysics of time such as presentism, the link between time and causation, and so on. In Chapter 25 Casey O'Callaghan discusses "Speech Perception". In this excellent article O'Callaghan argues that "the capacity to perceive speech in a manner that enables understanding is an acquired perceptual skill. It involves learning to hear language-specific types of ethologically significant sounds" (475). Chapter 26, "Musical Perception", by Charles Nussbaum is one of the least successful articles. It involves a dense and bewildering presentation of facts about the psychology of musical perception, with little effort to exploit their philosophical significance.
In Chapter 27, "Own-Body Perception", Alisa Mandrigin and Evan Thompson discuss the different ways in which one has a sense of ownership for one's body. They put their discussion to work in developing an understanding of certain autoscopic phenomena such as out-of-body experiences (which they conceive not as experiences of disembodiment, but rather of altered embodiment, 526). In Chapter 28 Valerie Gray Hardcastle discusses the "Perception of Pain". Part IV ends with Chapter 29, Roy Sorensen's "Perceiving Nothings". Sorensen discusses different positions one might take on understanding the perception of absences, and relevant metaphysical issues such as whether reality is fundamentally positive.
Part V Integrating Sensory Information
In Chapter 30, "The Individuation of the Senses", Mohan Matthen puts forward "two new ideas" (567). Firstly,
The senses constitute a group of information-gathering faculties within which content from each can be integrated with content from others . . . the senses are different from other information-gathering faculties because together they form a system by virtue of the content-integrating relations they bear to one another (567).
The second idea is that there are two approaches to distinguishing the senses, a more scientific, and a more folk-psychological approach. What the approaches have in common, linked to that above, is the idea that "in humans, the senses are modes of picking up information about the world for the purposes of rational control of action and belief" (583). But when it comes to distinguishing the senses, we need to recognize that we have two, as opposed to a single, conception of a sense. The first aligns closely to how scientists tend to think about how the senses are distinguished from each other. The other aligns more closely with folk ideas: "each modality is associated with a system of knowledge-gathering perceptual activities. These activities differentiate the modalities" (568). I'm sure researchers interested in the senses will gain much from considering Matthen's substantive discussion of and detailed arguments for these two ideas.
In Chapter 31, "Perceptual Attention", John Campbell develops a relationalist account of the phenomenology of conscious attention. Chapter 32, "Multisensory Perception", by Tim Bayne and Charles Spence, gives a helpful review of some of the scientific findings about multisensory perception and the processes underpinning it. This is then put to work in a section on philosophical implications (e.g., they argue that Fodorian modularity comes under pressure, 611-612). In Chapter 33, "Perceptual Constancy", Jonathan Cohen considers, among other things, whether colour constancy is a perceptual or a cognitive phenomenon. He argues that such "perceptual constancy is neither exclusively perceptual nor exclusively cognitive" (634). Rather, it appears to be an "interaction effect produced by several different mechanisms operating across different spatial and temporal scales -- some possibly more and some possibly less cognitive than others, depending on how one chooses to the mark the cognitive/non-cognitive distinction" (634).
In Chapter 34 Malika Auvray and Ophelia Deroy discuss "How Do Synaesthetes Experience The World?". They begin by noting that synaesthesia corresponds to a condition in which stimulation in one sensory or cognitive stream somehow leads to associated experiences in a second unstimulated stream (640). For instance, individuals who have colour experiences thanks to auditory stimulation (e.g., D, a subject for whom "the tone B2 looks green", 641). The authors note how various assumptions are made about synaesthesia in the literature. For instance, that it is  a single more or less unified condition, and  a condition in which individuals have an additional experience adjoined to a normal one (641). But Auvray and Deroy take a step back and provide an extremely clear and helpful critical evaluation of these (and other) assumptions. On  their survey of the literature shows that we as yet lack a clear, general, and explanatory set of categories for grouping and thinking about the various, diverse sorts of synaesthetic experiences. Regarding , they dispute what they call the "dualistic model" (646) according to which synaesthesia involves a trigger experience (say hearing a B2) and then an "additional" second experience (e.g., a colour experience). Instead they suggest that "In synaesthetic experience, the extra colour can be conceived as integrated into the character of the normal experience, and not as a standalone independent experience" (646).
Chapter 35, "Substituting the Senses", is by Julian Kiverstein, Mirko Farina, and Andy Clark. They discuss sensory substitution devices such as those created by Bach-y-Rita which converted visual images into vibrotactile stimuli to substitute for vision in blind subjects. The authors raise this question: do the perceptual states such devices help to implement remain in the substituting modality or do these states switch from the substituting modality to the substituted modality once the user has learned how to use the device? (660). They argue convincingly that neither answer is quite right. Instead, they suggest that sensory substitution devices can provide us with new senses or modes of perception (672).
Part VI Frameworks For Perception
In "Similarity Spaces" (Chapter 36), Diana Raffman discusses perceptual similarity (e.g., looking the same or different in a certain respect). In Chapter 37 Michael Rescorla discusses "Bayesian Perceptual Psychology". This involves an impressive and accessible introduction to the idea that perception involves unconscious Bayesian inference. Less accessible, but worth studying is Chapter 38, E. Samuel Winer and Michael Snodgrass's "Signal Detection Theory". In Chapter 39, "Information Theory", John Kulvicki discusses attempts to understand perception in terms of information. Fred Dretske has been a particularly influential proponent of an information-theoretic account. Kulvicki provides a helpful review of some of Dretske's views and critical reactions to them. Deroy (Chapter 40, "Modularity of Perception") discusses Fodorian modularity about the mind and especially perception. She considers various challenges to the modularist picture, including from the multisensory nature of sensory processing. Her stellar discussion judiciously ends with some hints at how the Fodorian approach might be modified to survive such challenges.
Part VII Broader Philosophical Issues
Chapter 41 is an overview of various issues in the "The Epistemology of Perception" by Susanna Siegel and Nicholas Silins. The discussion is helpfully structured around this question: supposing that perceptual experiences provide reasons (and thus justification) for beliefs, what features of experience account for this? The features they consider divide into two broad categories: those which are constitutive, and those which are merely causal or aetiological. For instance, they discuss the idea that it is because of its phenomenal character that experience has the justifying role it has, but also the idea that it is because of the reliability of the processes that give rise to experiences that they have their epistemic role. The issues and various positions are set out clearly and cautiously, making this a good starting point for those wishing to reflect further on the epistemology of perception.
In Chapter 42, "Perceptual Learning", Robert L. Goldstone and Lisa A. Byrge discuss the various ways in which perception and perceptual processes can be altered (sometimes improved) thanks to learning, experience and exposure. They discuss issues such as the loci of perceptual change, and the mechanisms of perceptual learning. This review piece is full of helpful pointers to and summaries of empirical literature on these themes. But it was never quite clear exactly what perceptual learning was supposed to be.
In Chapter 43, "Perception and Demonstratives", Imogen Dickie provides a thorough discussion of debates about how a perceptual link with an object can enable perceptual demonstrative thought about the object (833). In Chapter 44, "Nonhuman Animal Senses", Brian L. Keeley spends a great deal of time trying to convince the reader that nonhuman animal senses are philosophically interesting (whether or not one supposes that there is a deep continuity between human and nonhuman animal senses). Nonhuman animal senses, Keeley contends, are interesting in themselves, and studying them can sometimes tell us about our own senses. He discusses certain forms of infrared perception and magnetoreception (862ff). Finally, Chapter 45 is "Perception and Art" by Dominic McIver Lopes. One issue that Lopes discuses at length is the following. Suppose we agree that pictorial experiences have dual contents: whereby they typically represent "a flat, marked surface (typically a surface on a wall, bounded by a frame) . . . [and] a depicted scene -- a three-dimensional arrangement of shapes and colours, or a building, or the Eiffel Tower" (876). But now we can ask whether the character of pictorial experience is unitary or not with respect to these contents. Do they somehow figure in pictorial experience in a unitary way, and if so how? Or, to take but one alternative model, does pictorial experience involve a switching between them? Lopes helpfully reviews various options and arguments in this debate.
As we've seen, the volume covers a wide range of topics. But there are two puzzling omissions. First, the historical section of the book lacks a substantive discussion of Kant. This is puzzling not only because Kant had interesting views on perception (just like the others discussed in this section, e.g., Plato, Aristotle, Descartes, and Locke). But Kant has exerted and still exerts a significant influence on some aspects of contemporary philosophy of perception (perhaps more so than some of the other authors). This contemporary influence comes in different forms: in contemporary philosophy of perception, but also in contemporary Kant scholarship which brings Kant to contemporary philosophy of perception (or vice versa). On the latter, one might consult, for instance, Lucy Allais, (2015, Chapter 5); Andrew Stephenson (forthcoming), and Anil Gomes, (forthcoming). Regarding the former there is the McDowellian approach to perception a key aspect of which is a conceptualist understanding of perception. Here McDowell makes central Kant's (in)famous idea that intuitions without concepts are blind. (See McDowell (1994, 2009)).
A second puzzling omission is a dedicated discussion of one of the most prominent contemporary theories of conscious perceptual experience: intentionalism. Intentionalists focus on how to account for the phenomenal character of perceptual experiences. The idea is that the phenomenal character of an experience is to be accounted for in terms of its representational content, or more broadly its representational nature. There is a vast discussion of intentionalism in the literature on perceptual experience. One would thus expect to find an article on it included. Note that Nanay's article discusses what he calls representationalism, but this is not the same as intentionalism. Representationalism, as Nanay understands it, and as applied to perceptual experiences, just says that they have representational contents/they are representations, it doesn't assert anything at all about phenomenal character. (For an overview discussion of intentionalism, see Crane (2009)).
The philosophy of perception has its traditional topics. For instance, the problem of perception: how can perception be what it intuitively seems to be -- awareness of and openness to the mind-independent world -- given the existence of phenomena which are fundamentally the same as perception yet not like this (i.e., illusion, and hallucination)? And the problem of how to distinguish the senses: by what criteria are the different senses different senses? These topics are discussed in this book, but what the book proves is that there is so much more to the philosophy of perception than this. It's a great success.
The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Perception is a brilliant book. It's packed full of superb articles. If you want to read articles in the philosophy of perception which are informative, make original contributions, and are empirically engaged, look no further.
This work is supported by funding from the John Templeton Foundation as part of the University of Cambridge's New Directions in the Study of Mind. Many thanks to Bence Nanay for discussion.
Allais, Lucy. (2015). Manifest Reality: Kant's Idealism and his Realism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
Gomes, Anil. (Forthcoming). "Naïve Realism in Kantian Phrase". In: Mind.
McDowell, John. (1994). Mind and World. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
McDowell, John. (2009). Having the World in View. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
Nanay, Bence. (2014). "Empirical problems with anti-representationalism". In: Brogaard (ed.): Does Perception have Content? New York: Oxford University Press.
Robertson, Lynn. (2004). Space, Objects, Minds and Brains. Hove, East Sussex: Psychology Press.
Stephenson, Andrew. (Forthcoming). "Kant on the Object-Dependence of Intuition and Hallucination." In: The Philosophical Quarterly.