In this admirable book, S. Matthew Liao argues that children have a human right to be loved. With satisfyingly clear prose, he considers the main obstacles in the path to this conclusion and lays out an interesting and credible case. Although his book did not convince me that children have a right to be loved, it is a worthy contribution to a vital debate. (I also compliment Oxford University Press on their pricing; the hardback is extremely reasonable and the Kindle edition costs only $30.99.)
The first chapter lays out a new account of why humans have rights. Liao argues that humans have rights because they have the genetic basis for moral agency. Chapter Two develops a new account of human rights. Liao argues that human rights are rights to the fundamental conditions for pursuing a good life. In Chapter Three, Liao argues that for children, being loved is a fundamental condition, something that children need in order to become adults who can pursue basic activities. Therefore, Liao concludes, children have a right to be loved. Chapter Four considers the objection that it is not possible for anyone to have a right to be loved because rights correlate with duties and no one can have a duty to love. In Chapter Five, Liao argues that "every able person in appropriate circumstances has a duty to love every child" (189). Chapters Six and Seven discuss two implementation issues: licensing parents and adoption.
In Chapter One, Liao argues that humans are rightholders "because they all have the genetic basis for moral agency" (17). Liao presents this as a sufficient condition for being a rightholder and explicitly claims that it is not necessary. Thus, he leaves the door open to the possibility that other beings could have rights on some other basis (e.g., sentience). In addition, the term "genetic" is used as a convenient short-hand for having the physical basis for moral agency. In other words, the account does not imply that beings with no genes (perhaps an alien) are not rightholders. The causal role played by genes in humans who develop moral agency could be played by some other physical substances/structures in aliens. As long as that physical substance/structure plays the causal role that genes do in humans, then the aliens are rightholders.
Liao does not say enough about the sort of causal relationship that must exist between the physical substances/structures and moral agency in order for a being to be a rightholder. As it stands, Liao's view seems to imply that being alive is not a necessary condition for being a rightholder. It seems to imply that a stillborn infant with normal human genes is a rightholder. Given current and future technology, there are probably causal paths from a stillborn infant's genes to a being with moral agency. I suspect that Liao is assuming that "genetic basis" requires some sort of closer causal connection between genes and moral agency, but the nature of the required causal relationship is not spelled out.
There are some possible counterexamples to Liao's view. Suppose that Infant A and Infant B are both the offspring of human parents. One week after birth, both have no mental states and no reasonable prospect for attaining moral agency. Infant A has perfectly normal human genes. The lack of mental states is due to events that occurred in the middle of pregnancy. Infant B has severe genetic issues that originated prior to conception and made it physically impossible for this infant to have mental states. On Liao's view, Infant A is a rightholder. Infant B may or may not be a rightholder depending on whether there are sufficient conditions for being a rightholder other than having the genetic basis for moral agency. Some will think that if the current mental states of the two infants are the same, then they must have the same capacities for rights and have these capacities for the same reason.
Liao's view implies that human zygotes are rightholders. Thus, his view implies that abortions violate the rights of zygotes. As Judith Jarvis Thomson 1971 famously argued, this does not show that abortion is wrong. Some violations of rights are justified. However, some will think it implausible to hold that all abortions are violations of human rights. Moreover, Liao's view seems to imply that zygotes have a right to be loved. It seems to imply that individuals and governments have an extensive set of duties towards zygotes.
Chapter Two defends a four-step account of human rights. (a) Human rights are rights to the fundamental conditions for pursuing a good life. (b) A good life is one spent pursing basic activities. (c) Basic activities are "activities that are important to human beings qua human beings' life as a whole" (41). (d) Fundamental conditions are goods, capacities, and options that "human beings qua human beings need . . . in order to purse basic activities" (43).
To explicate the notion of "qua," Liao asserts that some things are important to people qua individuals while other things are important to people qua human begins. As examples of activities that are not basic (i.e., that are not important to human beings qua human beings), he lists sunbathing, being a professional philosopher, working to better the lives of those in need, driving, and adoptive parenting. As examples of activities that are basic (i.e., are important to human beings qua human beings), he lists deep personal relationships, knowledge, active pleasures (e.g., creative work and play), passive pleasure (e.g., appreciating beauty), and biological parenting.
Liao suggests that an activity is basic when "if a human life did not involve the pursuit of any of them, then that life could not be a good life" (42). However, on this view, one could show that any activity is a basic activity. Suppose that a proposed list of basic activities is: deep personal relationships, knowledge, active pleasures, passive pleasures, and sunbathing. A human life that did not involve any of these could not be a good life. But Liao explicitly says that sunbathing is not a basic activity.
Perhaps Liao intends to hold that basic activities are those on the shortest possible list such that, if a life did not involve any of them, it would not be a good life. However, this would imply that having any one of the things on the list would be sufficient for a good life. Consider a life of enormous suffering, no deep personal relationships, no pleasures, but a reasonable amount of knowledge. Few would call such a life a good life. Overall, the notion of "qua" is insufficiently explicated.
This problem is important because the notion of a basic activity is key to Liao's argument that biological parenting is a basic activity (and thus a human right), but adoptive parenting is not. He argues that biological parenting is a basic activity because it involves (a) creating a new being who (b) is a rightholder that is (c) created with one's own genetic material and (d) provides one with the opportunity to see how a being that is created with one's genes grows and develops. The link between these four features of biological parenting and "activities that are important to human beings qua human beings" is not clear. One could argue that adopting an orphaned child who is facing extreme poverty in Sudan is a basic activity because it involves (a') saving a being who is a rightholder from massive rights violations (including violations of the right to be loved) and who (b') is a member of one's own species and who (c') provides one with the opportunity to see how such a being grows and develops. Absent a clearer explication of "qua," it is not clear why (a)-(d) are sufficient to make an activity basic but (a')-(c') are not.
On Liao's account, human rights are necessarily tied to the biology of humans. Spock, a Vulcan, cannot have human rights. Some will regard this as speciesist. It also seems to be in tension with the account of rightholders in Chapter One. A virtue of the account of rightholders offered in Chapter One was that it was not tied to the biology of humans. As I was reading Chapter One, I expected that, since having the genetic basis for moral agency made one a rightholder, human rights would be rights to the fundamental conditions needed to be a moral agent. Such an account would be species-neutral. However, Liao rejects agency-based accounts of human rights (e.g., Griffin 2008).
Chapter Two ends with a convincing refutation of political conceptions of human rights (e.g., Rawls 1999 and Beitz 2009). Chapter Three is a well-argued defense of the importance of love for children's well-being. Liao holds that, for children, being loved is a fundamental condition for pursuing a good life. Therefore, he concludes that children have a right to be loved.
Chapter Four considers the objection that no one has a right to be loved because rights correlate with duties, one can have duties only if one can perform those duties, and feelings of love are not under our command. Therefore, no one can have a duty to love. Liao argues that our emotions are under our command. He points to three ways we control our emotions. First, he believes that we can give ourselves reasons to have particular emotions. He points to the example of someone who is in a bad mood on the day of a friend's wedding. Reflecting on the fact that being in a bad mood at someone's wedding would put a damper on a joyous occasion gives one a reason to be joyful. Second, he believes that reflection on the causes of emotions can bring about a change in emotions. For example, one might feel contempt for a person because one is jealous. Refection on this fact can cause the contemptuous feeling to fade away. Third, he believes that we can consciously put ourselves in situations in order to bring about emotions. For example, when I am in a bad mood, I know that certain sorts of music can put me in a good mood. I can then play those sorts of music to put myself in a good mood.
Liao makes a convincing case that some emotions are, to some degree, under our control. However, he did not convince me that the particular emotion of being in love is under our control or that humans have the level of control of our feelings of love needed in order to have a duty to love. I was unable to love my sons until they were four or five months old. I felt horrible guilt about my inability to love (or even like) my infant sons. I tried all three of techniques suggested by Liao. They all failed. I was able to love my sons only when their mental abilities increased. (Their sleeping through the night also helped.) In at least two cases, I attempted to love a woman. In these cases I also tried all three of the techniques suggested by Liao. I felt that I had extremely strong reasons to love these women, but I was unable to do so. Regarding my current wife, I had strong reasons not to love her. I sincerely felt that it would be better if I did not love her. However, I was unable to control my feelings of love. It is definitely possible that I am deficient when it comes to control of my emotions of love. On the other hand, I currently feel deep love for my wife and sons. In addition, music and literature are full of claims that love is beyond our control. Love is a specific emotion and it might not be under our control or not be sufficiently under our control for us to have a duty to love.
Chapter Five defends "the striking claim" (9) that "every able person in appropriate circumstances has a duty to love every child" (189). However, it then goes on to distinguish primary and associate duties. "Under normal circumstances, biological parents would have the primary duty directly to love their children, while all other able persons would have associate duties to help the primary dutybearers successfully discharge their duties" (135). So it turns out that it is not the case that everyone has a duty to have feelings of love towards every child. This makes Liao's view more plausible and less striking. Chapter Six discusses the regulation of biological parenting and Chapter Seven discusses adoption and the problem of children without adequate parents. As noted above, the discussion of these issues is hampered by the incomplete explication of "qua."
I have used most of the words of this review to point out what I see as flaws in Liao's arguments. However, I do not intend to imply that this book is unsatisfactory. On the contrary, as I said at the beginning of this review, Liao has made a valuable contribution that merits careful consideration. Whether you agree with him or not, Liao raises important questions, makes important arguments, and considers the views of others skillfully and fairly. Those interested in the issues discussed above will profit from reading this book.
Beitz, Charles. 2009. The Idea of Human Rights. Oxford University Press.
Griffin, James. 2008. On Human Rights. Oxford University Press.
Rawls, John. 1999. The Law of Peoples. Harvard University Press.
Thomson, Judith Jarvis. 1971. "A Defense of Abortion," Philosophy and Public Affairs 1: 47-66.