2018.04.03

Andrew Jason Cohen

Toleration and Freedom from Harm: Liberalism Reconceived

Andrew Jason Cohen, Toleration and Freedom from Harm: Liberalism Reconceived, Routledge, 2018, 217 pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138631588.

Reviewed by Peter de Marneffe, Arizona State University


The sole end for which mankind are warranted, individually or collectively, in interfering with the liberty of action of any of their number is self-protection. . . . The only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others.

You might recognize this passage. It is from the first chapter of Mill's On Liberty. Andrew Jason Cohen agrees with it. He presents it four times in his book as a block quote (3, 48, 83, 103).

The principle stated by Mill's passage is known as the harm principle. Cohen accepts this principle. He believes it, or something like it, identifies the best understanding of toleration. Toleration, he thinks, is the central normative commitment of liberalism. So, he thinks, liberalism, on the best understanding, is committed to Mill's harm principle or something like it.

According to Cohen, a better formulation of the harm principle is this.

HP1A*: The only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over an agent, against her will, is to prevent that agent from harming others or to set minimal policies, including those involving the minimal necessary taxation needed to reliably prevent all harms to others, no matter who would do the harm. (106)

By harm Cohen means a "wrongful setback of interests" (50). If a setback of interests is not wrongful, it does not count as harm.

A predictable question is, when is a setback of interests wrongful? Cohen does not tell us. He might have said it is wrongful when it violates a person's rights, but Cohen does not endorse this view. Early on he writes, "I will say very little about rights in this book" (12). He remains true to his word.

Another predictable question is, what constitutes a "setback of interests"? Cohen suggests it is a decrease in well-being, where he uses the phrase "one's interest, understood as well-being" (50). So perhaps he means by harm a wrongful reduction of well-being. If so, making this explicit would have been helpful.

Suppose this is what he does mean. Another predictable question is, what about actions that create a risk of injury but do not actually injure anyone? An action is harmful on this view only if it reduces well-being. But if a risky activity never injures anyone, it does not reduce anyone's well-being, and is consequently not harmful. It would appear to follow from the harm principle that the government may not prohibit an action that creates a risk of harm -- no matter how great the risk or how grave the harm -- if this action is, as it turns out, non-injurious. This seems like a problem.

Cohen's principle has a wrinkle, though, that might allow policies that reduce risk of harm. HP1A* does not say that the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over an agent, against her will, is to prevent that agent from harming others. It identifies this as one legitimate function of government but identifies another legitimate function, too: setting minimal policies, including those involving the minimal necessary taxation needed to reliably prevent all harms to others. "The minimal necessary taxation needed to reliably prevent all harms to others" refers to the taxation necessary to maintain a system of criminal and civil law, which protects everyone from harm. This kind of taxation is given as an example of the kind of "minimal policies" that HP1A* allows, but it is not the only policy that might count as "minimal." So perhaps HP1A* allows "minimal policies" that reduce risk of harm by prohibiting non-harmful actions. Because Cohen offers no definition of "minimal policies," there is no way to tell.

Searching for more clues to how Cohen's principle might handle the issue of risk, one might scrutinize his assertion that HP1A* is "functionally equivalent to the requirement that the only permissible interferences . . . by a governing regime on its citizens or others are those necessary to reliably protect freedom from harm for all" (109). But this doesn't help. In one sense of "reliably protect," no policy reliably protects everyone from harm. There are laws against murder and people are still murdered. So, it seems, the functionally equivalent principle must be something like this: the only permissible government policies are those that function to reduce the risk of harm for all, as murder laws do. This would explain why taxation that funds the criminal and civil justice systems is permissible and also why it is permissible to prohibit risky actions that result in no harm. But it creates problems, too. Suppose everyone's risk of harm is reduced by laws prohibiting the manufacture and sale of alcohol. Mill clearly opposed such laws in On Liberty, and one would guess from his rhetoric that Cohen would oppose them, too. Is there a principled basis, then, for allowing the government to prohibit some non-harmful actions to reduce risk of harm but not others? If so, what is it?

Cohen's statement of the harm principle raises many questions, then, which this reader wishes he had answered more explicitly, in a way this reader could recognize and understand. Even if we had a crystal-clear statement of the harm principle, though, another predictable question would arise. Why is this principle valid?

A standard objection to the harm principle is that it prohibits the government from prohibiting non-harmful actions the cumulative effect of which reduces human well-being. Consider a law that prohibits burning wood in a fireplace in certain weather conditions. Suppose that if everyone who wishes to burn wood in these weather conditions were to do so, the resulting air pollution would cause health problems, reducing human well-being, lower than it would be without this law. Suppose, however, that the amount of pollution that any individual fire would add is not enough to constitute a wrongful reduction of anyone's well-being. Then no one would harm anyone else by burning wood. The harm principle would then require the government to allow burning wood in these weather conditions, even though this would lower human well-being. If obeying the harm principle results in lower well-being, why is it valid? If Cohen's book offers an answer, I was unable to find it.

Then there is the issue of paternalism. Understood in one way, paternalism refers to the following view:

The fact that a person will be better off when his liberty is limited in some way is a good reason for the government to limit his liberty in this way, even if he opposes this policy. Although this reason might be decisively outweighed, reasons of this kind should be counted and in some circumstances will be sufficient to justify the limitation in question.

Mill's harm principle is a rejection of this view. It says that the fact that a person will be better off when his liberty is limited is never a good reason for the government to limit his liberty when he opposes this policy. Reasons of this kind should not be counted, and there are no circumstances in which reasons of this kind are sufficient to justify the government in limiting a person's liberty against his will. Mill's harm principle is therefore a principle of antipaternalism. So is Cohen's HP1A*. What reason, then, is there to think that principles of antipaternalism like Mill's and Cohen's are valid?

No reason, I would say. Cohen gives some broadly utilitarian arguments for toleration (68-82), but they don't explain why HP1A* is valid. This is partly because they don't explain why every alternative principle of liberty is invalid, including those that recognize and protect rights to basic liberties but allow a limited range of paternalistic policies. In Chapter Seven, Cohen briefly considers some arguments against the harm principle, but does not address any of the recent attacks on antipaternalism by Danny Scoccia, Sarah Conly, Jason Hanna, and others. "I will not extensively discuss paternalism," he announces with notable understatement. "I don't find any of the newer work seeking to defend it persuasive even where such work has improved discussion" (134). Why does he find this recent work unpersuasive? This, too, he leaves unexplained.