John Woods

Truth in Fiction: Rethinking its Logic

John Woods, Truth in Fiction: Rethinking its Logic, Springer, 2018, 239pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319726571.

Reviewed by Manuel García-Carpintero, University of Barcelona

In this book, John Woods comes back to issues he addressed in his groundbreaking The Logic of Fiction (1975), from a novel "naturalist" perspective. The main problem the book confronts is "fiction's (alleged) systemic and untroubling inconsistency" (188). This supposed inconsistency is established "by a large body of empirically discernible data of material relevance to the facts of lived literary experience of its readers and writers" (189), which makes manifest to "Everyone who has ever thought about the stories people read . . . that what they read is true in the stories and false in the world" (191). These crisp formulations come from the final pages, but the book is peppered with similar claims. The reader might object that the last statement doesn't really present an inconsistency; this is because it incorporates one of the two solutions the book offers, summarized below. Here is a more straightforward statement, from the preface: "I take it as given that the most semantically distinctive feature of the sentences of fiction is that they are unambiguously true and false together" (xi).

Perhaps the most significant departure from Woods's earlier book lies in this book's pervasive skepticism about formal methods in philosophy, specifically those used to illuminate the topics in philosophical logic and related areas of the philosophy of language, epistemology, and metaphysics. The book, we are told, "arises from the belief that most of the known logics of fiction to date, including my own earlier one, are suboptimal with respect to what matters most about fiction" (5). This is shown in that "they are not well-matched to empirically discernible data of literary experience", so that "most of what matters for reference, truth and inference in human cognitive practice is not adequately catered for by the standard formal methods, and is better dealt with in a more naturalistic way" (ibid.). This new found "naturalism" is what the two quoted appeals to empirical data aim to honor. The final chapter examines the extent to which the deliverances of formal methods can be understood as scientific models -- frictionless worlds. Woods complains that what, along such lines, is sold as descriptive conceptual analysis is frequently intended instead as prescriptive engineering that disrespects the allegedly naturalistically established facts. And it distrusts in any case, from that perspective, the illumination they can offer.

The book's main target, however, is not any old account dressed in formal machinery. It is in fact the deservedly influential pretense-theoretic account by Kendall Walton (1990), from which most contemporary proposals (including my own) are elaborations. Walton didn't intend his proposal as a descriptive conceptual analysis, but rather, I take it, as a form of engineering: a suggestion about how to better understand our topics in order to have clear-headed critical discussions about them. To be a bit more precise on what these topics are at their core, with Andrea Bonomi (2008) I find it useful to distinguish three different sorts of discourse involving fictions, illustrated by (1)-(3):

(1) When Gregor Samsa woke, he found himself transformed into a gigantic vermin.

(2) According to Metamorphosis, when Gregor Samsa woke, he found himself transformed into a gigantic vermin.

(3) Gregor Samsa is a fictional character.

Bonomi's distinction is not clear-cut; while, as Anthony Everett (2013, 163-178) emphasizes, on the one hand there are mixed cases, on the other we could make it finer-grained. In fact, Woods distinguishes seven categories (73-4). But Bonomi's distinction is helpful for my purposes. The first category is that of an utterance by Kafka of the German sentence translated by (1), as part of the longer utterance by him of the full discourse which, with some idealization, we can think might constitute the act of putting forward his Metamorphosis as a finished piece. Bonomi calls these uses textual. Even though Woods would not now accept this characterization, what sets them apart is that intuitively they are not clearly truth-evaluable. 'Gregor Samsa', we would intuitively say, fails to refer to anything; given this, a flat-out assertion of (1) would intuitively fail to be true, and would therefore be incorrect. However, we don't intuitively find it plausible to criticize Kafka on this count, in the way we would criticize a default assertion of (1). The two other types do intuitively appear to be truth-evaluable. There is, firstly, the use of sentences such as (1) when we report what goes on in a fiction, that is, the character of the fictional world it presents, its plot. We'll call these uses paratextual. According to David Lewis (1978), they are simply elliptical for intuitively equivalent ascriptions of propositional content like (2), which on such grounds I'll also count as paratextual. Readers of Metamorphosis would count (1) in such a use as true, as they would (2), and as false the results of substituting 'rat' for 'vermin' in them. Finally, I will call the uses of sentences such as (3) metatextual; they are intuitively truth-evaluable, but not content-reporting, in that they are not (or at least not obviously) equivalent to explicit content ascriptions like (2).

I understand that Woods shares the view that any theory of fiction and fictional discourse should be grounded on an account of textual discourse. This is what I take his main proposals (offered to address the inconsistency mentioned above) to be aiming for. As said, such proposals are set up in contrast with Walton's "pretendism", nicely elaborated recently in a sharp way by Everett (2013). Pretendism subscribes to four Basic Laws of Fiction (2-3, 35):

I   The something law: Everything whatever is something or other.

II   The existence law: Reference and quantification are existentially loaded.

III  The truth law: No sentence violating the existence law can be true.

IV  The fiction law: The sentences of fiction fail to refer and they fail to be true.

Woods is right, I think, that pretendists like Walton accept these "laws". In particular, they accept IV for our three uses of fictional sentences, and for the occurrences of fictional terms like 'Gregor Samsa' in all of them. In contrast, Woods is happy to accept the first "law", but he resolutely rejects the other three, grounding this on his "naturalism".

Pretendists are sensitive to the criticism that, intuitively, metatextual and paratextual discourse feels assertoric and truth-evaluable, and they have proposed ways of explaining (away) such intuitions. Pretendism is on intuitively solid ground when it comes to textual discourse; thus, the authors of the two other (by my reckoning) most influential works on current debates on these topics in addition to Walton's, Kripke (2013) and Lewis (1978), support forms of it. My main complaint about the book is methodological, and concerns what I consider the uncritical way in which "naturalism" (which I have been scare-quoting so far on account of this) is deployed in order to reject pretendism even for textual uses. For, as far as I have been able to discern, Woods's naturalism consists merely in an appeal to his own intuitions that the declarative sentences penned by fiction makers are, as such, unambiguously assertoric, and unambiguously true (and false too, but I'll leave that aside for the moment).

Beyond that reliance on Woods's own intuitions, as far as I can tell we don't get any empirical data supporting the dismissals of the proposals that defenders of pretendism have made to explain our occasional unreflective willingness to count textual uses as true, or even to bet on them (105). (See, in addition to Walton's and Everett's already mentioned discussion, Mark Sainsbury's (2005, 2010) distinction between truth and fidelity.) It is not just that this will not be persuasive to those of us who share pretendist intuitions about textual discourse. It is rather that, even if Woods offered truly empirical results from well drafted x-phi experiments, they would be incapable of establishing on their own that 'true' is used "unambiguously" when applied to textual utterances. For this is a theoretical matter, which can only be decided on the basis of abductive considerations -- not the kind of thing that can be taken "as given".

Woods does have an argument against the pretendist account of textual utterances, which he develops in the first two chapters; but it seems to me to rely on a blanket appeal to those questionable intuitions. He contends that it is "empirically discernible that no one in the world has organized his beliefs and structured his practice to comply with these legislations" (the Basic Laws). The reason he provides in support of this is that, if "readers believed that the story is about nothing, that its predicates ascribe nothing and that its sentences say nothing, they would never have been readers in the first place" (17; see also 34). Moreover, it is one more "empirical fact that no one in the world experiences himself as pretending, play-acting or make-believing" (18). I just fail to see why we should accept these sweeping claims, for which no discernible justification is given other than the "naturalistic" reliance on intuitions. Assuming the claims, Woods goes on to contend that pretendists are doomed to ascribe widespread semantic error to ordinary speakers, an "indictment so sweeping and so dire" that it places the view "in the ranks of 'big box skepticism', which in its application here is a slur on humanity" (18).

As Sainsbury (2010, 26-31) points out, the fact that by taking textual utterances to be literally, unambiguously true we commit ourselves to accepting claims we don't believe, including straightforward contradictions (every reader being well aware of it), is a very good reason in fact to question the claims that Woods's naturalism leads him to endorse. Woods grants that readers straightforwardly accept contradictions, because they take textual utterances to be at the same time literally, unambiguously true and false, and as we have seen his main aim is to offer a philosophical account of this. In fact, he offers two. The second, developed in the penultimate chapter, is that we cognitively quarantine the effects of the contradictions we accept. This is not because we somehow dismiss in our cognitive economy ex falso quodlibet; Woods offers an interesting argument to conclude that "it is valid for English" (181-2). It is rather because we in some way "filter" as irrelevant many consequences of what we believe.

This, however, is not the solution to which most space is devoted; it is instead one intimated in a quotation given above (developed in chapter four) whose epistemological underpinnings are given in the previous one: we don't in fact ultimately accept contradictions. The reason is that truth, in a fundamental ontological sense that Woods derives from Aristotle (129), is relative to "respects" or "sites". Facts like the one (1) states are only facts "in situ the story", but not "in situ the world" (86). We are not told much about sites; legal codes are offered as illustrations of such truth-making sites. Woods's privileged solution is then that (1) is true at a site, Kafka's story, which consists of facts for which Kafka is the primary maker, hence their truth-maker. (1) is false at another site, the actual world, on whose maker Woods doesn't dwell -- although he does consider the avenues this offers to different forms of fictionalism (88-91).

I do think that some version of pretendism offers a globally nicer articulation of what we believe and say about these matters, and hence earlier I felt the urge to say something in reply to Woods's considerations against it. However, although I stick to my introductory characterization of textual uses above, I accept that there might be theoretical reasons to go along with views like Woods's, on which they are literally semantically true or false. In any case, I think this might be an alternative story worth developing. This is due to the quizzicalist attitude I share with Stephen Yablo (2014) about these and other philosophical matters; I take a fictionalist attitude about them, because I cannot envisage any way in which they could be decided by sticking to purely philosophical methods. (I do accept that some philosophical questions have empirical implications, and can be decided on empirical bases.) My only complaint about Woods's proposal is that it doesn't mention obvious precedents in the literature. They are also more theoretically elaborated -- but this probably will not move Woods, given his skepticism about the illumination that formal approaches might provide.

As said above, Lewis (1978, 262), Kripke (2013, 74) and others suggest that paratextual uses are elliptical for the likes of (2). Michael Devitt (1981, 172) also extends a similar ellipsis account to textual uses, on which they are elliptical for sentences including an operator to be read as "it is pretended that". There are serious objections to ellipsis views, however. Stefano Predelli (1997), Marga Reimer (2005) and Alberto Voltolini (2006) have advanced alternative but equally semantic contextualist views, which on the face of it look very similar to Woods's. The context in which 'The battle unfolded now.' is uttered might require us to evaluate the assertion not with respect to the time where the utterance takes place, but with respect to another, contextually provided one, for instance in a historical present narrative. (Woods offers a related supporting example, 88.) On these authors' views, the context of fictional uses of (1) similarly leads us to evaluate their truth not at the actual world, but at a counterfactual or imaginary one, "the" world of the fiction. Predelli and Reimer present their views in a possible worlds semantics, which Woods dislikes; but Voltolini's proposal is close also in this regard.

Literalist, semantic proposals like these -- in contrast with the more straightforwardly pragmatic take of pretendists -- adopt Woods's attitude about the Basic Laws. They are thus committed to posit exotic ficta for 'Gregor Samsa' to refer to and for the relevant claims to be true of, ficta such as Meinongian nonexistents, possibilia, or perhaps abstract created objects. Woods considers the semantic and ontological issues related to fictional terms in chapters 5-8 and rejects all these options in favor of a more idiosyncratic one. The view that he outlines is close to Meinongian accounts; it would certainly count as such on Sainsbury's (2010, 45-6) standard characterization. Woods's main complaint against Meinongian objects is that they are usually taken to be incomplete (157): for some properties, they neither have them nor their complements (in the proper sense of "having" for such objects, perhaps instantiating at the contextually given site). Woods would be right to fear that this exposes the view to what many consider the main objection to it, namely its incapacity to determinately select referents for referential expressions (Bueno and Zalta 2017, 761-4; Sainsbury 2010, 57-63). Woods astoundingly contends in reply that Sherlock Holmes is a fully determinate object. He relies on a variety of the "Reality Principle" that Lewis (1978) and Walton (1990) take authors and readers to assume for specifying "the site" of the story. Woods' version (80-1) looks closer to Stacie Friend's (2017, 29) Reality Assumption that "everything that is (really) true is also fictionally the case, unless excluded by the work".

I take this to be a serious cost for Woods's view. He assumes a view glaringly in conflict with intuitions, for someone who relies on them so heavily. Woods claims that our deficit when it comes to determining "how many strands of hair Sherlock had at 9:30 a.m. on February 14th, 1887" is exactly of the same nature as the application of the same property to Gladstone at the same time, or France's head of state at 9:30 a.m. on February 14th, 2018: a merely epistemic matter, as opposed to an ontological one (80, 118). It doesn't take any worrying form of verificationism to dismiss Timothy Williamson's epistemicism about vagueness. But Williamson at least has a story to tell about what might fix the ontically fully determinate extension of 'sort of slightly bald' he assumes, in spite of our being a priori unable ever to know it -- even if we can dismiss it as lacking in explanatory significance. Woods doesn't have this. Since, on his view, Arthur Conan Doyle's decisions are the primary truth-makers for claims about Sherlock, how could the world determine one way or another the facts about Sherlock's hirsuteness? We are entitled to surmise that Doyle could have never considered Williamson's line, but, even if he did, that wouldn't help. The problem lies not with the vagueness of any particular term, but with how the world might fix the number of Sherlock's strands of hair at a given time, in the absence of any indications from Doyle on the matter. I cannot see how Woods might have a plausible answer to this concern.

As I am sure the passages quoted have shown, this is an opinionated book. It has thought-provoking views on many more issues than I have been able to discuss here; for instance, on a reliabilist epistemology for our engagement with fictional "sites", or on its emotional effects. That alone justifies the read. In addition, Woods is a very good writer, opinionated also about the words he uses: choosing, say, 'impalpable' for abstract, 'site' for world, or labels like 'no spine-no readers' views (82), or 'command and control epistemology' (51). This makes the book an enjoyable read. I unhesitatingly recommend it to readers interested in these topics, and urge them to appraise for themselves the qualms I have expressed.


Thanks to Fred Kroon and Alberto Voltolini for comments on a previous version, and to Michael Maudsley for his grammatical revision.

Financial support for my work was provided by the DGI, Spanish Government, research project FFI2016-80588-R and the award ICREA Academia for excellence in research, 2013, funded by the Generalitat de Catalunya.


Bonomi, Andrea (2008): "Fictional Contexts", in P. Bouquet, L. Serafini and R. Thomason (eds), Perspectives on context, Stanford: CSLI Publications, 213-248.

Bueno, O., and Zalta, E. (2017): "Object Theory and Modal Meinongianism", Australasian Journal of Philosophy 95(4), 761-778.

Devitt, Michael (1981): Designation. MIT Press.

Everett, Anthony (2013): The Nonexistent, Oxford University Press.

Friend, Stacie (2017): "The Real Foundations of Fictional Worlds", Australasian Journal of Philosophy 95(1), 29-42.

Kripke, Saul (2013): Reference and Existence, Oxford University Press (based on the John Locke lectures originally delivered in 1973).

Lewis, David (1978): "Truth in Fiction," American Philosophical Quarterly 15, 37-46. Reprinted with postscripts in D. Lewis, Philosophical Papers, vol. 1, pp. 261-280, Oxford University Press, 1983.

Predelli, Stefano (1997): "Talk about Fiction", Erkenntnis 46, 69-77.

Reimer, Marga (2005): "The Ellipsis Account of Fiction-talk", in R. Elugardo and R. Stainton (eds.), Ellipsis and Nonsentential Speech, Springer, 203-215.

Sainsbury, Mark (2005): Reference without Referents, Clarendon Press.

Sainsbury, Mark (2010): Fiction and Fictionalism, Routledge.

Voltolini, Alberto (2006): "Fiction as a Base of Interpretation Contexts", Synthese 153, 23-47.

Walton, Kendall (1990): Mimesis and Make-Believe. Harvard University Press.

Yablo, Stephen (2014): "Carnap's Paradox and Easy Ontology", Journal of Philosophy cxi, 9/10: 470-501.