2020.06.06

Sophia Vasalou

Virtues of Greatness in the Arabic Tradition

Sophia Vasalou, Virtues of Greatness in the Arabic Tradition, Oxford University Press, 2019, 169pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198842828.

Reviewed by Anna Ayse Akasoy, The Graduate Center, CUNY


What does it mean to be great? Whom shall we call great? How can we become great? Is greatness the same as goodness? These questions involve fundamental ethical assumptions, concepts and concerns. Like many who addressed such issues in the past, we often use virtues -- courage, generosity, forbearance, etc. -- in order to explain what greatness means, reflecting a common notion that greatness requires moral integrity. Virtues describe our ambitions and aspirations, as individuals and as communities. How we give credit for moral achievements is presumably also culturally conditioned, just as the way we relate to our accomplishments in general reflects social and historical context. Studies on the Dunning-Kruger effect suggest that while North Americans regularly overestimate their abilities, in Japan the opposite appears to be the case. Other variables too are sometimes debated. The self-citation rate among male scientists is often reported to be higher than among their female peers, which might reflect a higher estimation of their achievements. Differences are also believed to be generational and related to educational practices around appreciation and rewards. Recent public debates have shed light on the psychological and emotional costs of self-optimizing and the social and political dynamics of virtue-signaling. Likewise, who our role models should be and how they are selected often reveals the diverging views of greatness in a society. Even a brief survey of these and similar discussions suggests that the philosophical problem of greatness can be of significant interest to contemporary readers.

In her book, Sophia Vasalou discusses a slightly more specific concept, greatness of soul or greatness of spirit, in medieval Arabic literature. Most of the sources are conventionally classified as philosophical and as such typically indebted to ancient Greek concepts and texts, in this case primarily Aristotle. Greatness here serves as a meta-virtue or perhaps as a propaedeutic virtue, the ability, disposition and determination of a person to be virtuous, and -- critically -- involves some view as to how credit for moral achievements is assigned. Vasalou traces evolving views from ancient Greek to medieval Islamic literature and demonstrates that while some aspects -- such as the function as a meta-virtue -- remain similar across traditions, others changed significantly. In ancient literature, 'greatness', or more specifically greatness of the soul, involves that a person is aware of their achievements and greatness and realizes that they deserve the accompanying honor. Such a disposition was highly problematic for medieval Christian authors who cherished humility, as earlier scholarship has shown. Vasalou suggests that similar reservations motivated Muslim authors in their own approaches to the subject. To them, humility was a recognition of our indebtedness to God and our own inferior nature. Furthermore, insofar as greatness involves external goals, the ascetic disregard for the material world cast doubts on this component as well.

The book consists of two main parts and a postlude. Part 1 and the Postlude contain previously published material. In the first part, Vasalou traces the reception history of the Greek philosophical concept of the greatness of the soul. The two critical sources are Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics and his Rhetoric. Aristotle used the term megalopsychia to describe achievement in the realm of virtues, the resulting self-regard and the honor a person considers themselves entitled to as a consequence. As Vasalou points out, more than many others, this particular concept has been criticized by contemporary authors as contingent on Aristotle's historical context. Disclosed as false universalism, it appears superseded. This may have already been the case in early Abbasid times when Aristotle's works were translated into Arabic. The Arabic term kibar al-nafs, Vasalou argues, did not quite resonate with medieval authors. She adduces linguistic-philological as well as conceptual evidence. In the former register, the term does not appear to have enjoyed a significant afterlife, but largely vanished from Arabic literature. Philosophical, theological and cultural frictions may very well account for this development.

While Part 1 discusses the development of a concept which petered out, Part 2 focuses on a parallel, but successful concept, greatness of spirit ('izam al-himma), a phrase which appears much more widely in medieval Arabic literature. Authors surveyed throughout the book include well-known philosophers such as Miskawayh (d. 1030), al-Ghazali (d. 1111), al-Raghib al-Isfahani (d. 1108), the Christian Yahya ibn Adi (d. 974), but also the litterateur Ibn Qutayba (d. 889). Vasalou suggests that the malleable nature of this concept allowed it to flourish in such a way. 'Greatness of spirit' was used in order to modify the strength of a moral pursuit and could be adapted to the particularities of that endeavor.

In the Postlude, Vasalou makes a case that these historical deliberations can be usefully brought in conversation with contemporary philosophical debates. A critical question is the extent to which greatness can be configured as a substantially different virtue which can sit alongside generosity or courage. Such an individually recognizable profile might be required in order to make embracing it less arbitrary. Another important aspect is the open-endedness of moral ambition as implied in greatness of spirit according to medieval authors. If our ultimate aim is to emulate the divine, for example, there is no end to our striving. This is hard to reconcile with a more recent recognition of the importance of realistic expectations and of the limitations of human psychology. Then again, as Vasalou illustrates, the medieval understanding of greatness may inspire concerns about low expectations and about the manner in which realistic expectations are determined. Related to this issue, it might be interesting to consider such ambitions of virtue in the context of more comprehensive projects of self-improvement. Morality might sit at the heart of our motivations and drive our ambitions in the practical sphere, from political and social engagement to our dietary and athletic habits, to our intellectual, cultural and aesthetic endeavors. To consider virtuous ambitions in such different practical contexts and in a holistic sense as a project of the good life might reveal further intersections between medieval and contemporary deliberations.

Conversely, contemporary examples may help us understand how medieval authors imagined greatness of spirit in practice. By considering mirrors for princes, Vasalou already introduces one literary genre which involves a specific sphere of action: governance. In many philosophical texts it can be hard to appreciate what, if anything, medieval authors had in mind when they wrote about the virtues and greatness. A further expansion of the selection of literary testimonies might help as well. Vasalou refers to the heroic virtues of pre-Islamic times, but in Islamic times, too, men were celebrated for their heroism. The narrative cycles of Arabic heroic romances such as the Sirat Baybars may be worth exploring in order to gain a better sense of what might have constituted greatness to medieval Muslims, in which situations in life one could demonstrate one's greatness and who might have served as a model in which regards.

Seeing virtue and moral ambition in context might allow us to recognize how such discourse about the virtues might be related to other spheres of human interaction. Vasalou, for example, cites Hume to illustrate a trend in which self-effacement became considered a remnant of a theological past. Other purposes of ostentatious humility come to mind. In his Homer's Turk: How Classics Shaped Ideas of the East (Harvard University Press, 2013), Jerry P. Toner discusses Robert Clive, a notorious figure in the history of the British Raj. Asked about the material wealth he had acquired in India, Clive infamously commented, 'I stand astonished at my own moderation.' That the agent of the East India Company was presented with such a question shows that he was controversial by the standards of his own day, but there is little doubt that today's heroes can be tomorrow's villains. What western European colonial officials called generosity and a moral obligation towards the world's less fortunate people appears nowadays a fairly transparent discursive strategy. Accompanied by ideologies of racial, cultural and religious superiority, they were meant to disguise and justify ambitions of political domination and economic exploitation. Likewise, even within a cultural unit, virtues and moral ambition often serve similar aims -- the generosity of the prosperous can function as a strategy to preserve and solidify the structures of an economically stratified society. Medieval philosophers were not egalitarians. Their intellectual and social elitism does not comport well with contemporary philosophers. This too, however, is an aspect where delving into past thoughts might turn out to be constructive for present-day discussions. As Vasalou emphasizes, an engagement with historical ideas does not require agreement. Contemplating differences may be just as productive.

What will make this study interesting to a greater variety of readers than historians of Arabic or Islamic philosophy is that Vasalou combines linguistic and philological with philosophical analysis and thus taps into different methodological preferences. She can identify conceptual renderings of the idea of greatness, but especially since greatness of spirit is so hard to capture, she usefully focuses on evidence of a 'signature linguistic pattern' (166) as well. Linguistic innovations in the English language such as humble-bragging might offer interesting parallels for further explorations of a vocabulary of virtues and greatness. Another strength of the analysis is that in addition to discussing philosophical literature, she includes texts more commonly classified as literary, such as mirrors for princes. Vasalou's explanations are clear and accessible even for readers without a background in Islamic history. She introduces all relevant authors and their texts, pointing out problems of authorship and textual histories where pertinent. Philological and historical analyses are effectively combined with philosophical discussion to the benefit of both academic fields.

Vasalou's book will also interest scholars studying cultural contacts and the transmission of ideas across cultures. The fate of greatness in Arabic philosophical literature is presented as a contribution to histories of cultural conflict. This involves a host of methodological issues readers might wish to consider. It is not hard to think of the many ways in which culture can have an impact on the ways we think about moral ambition and achievement. The studies of the Dunning-Kruger effect illustrate the significance of individual or communal orientations, for example, or entitlement and obligation. At the same time, other variables such as gender or generation illustrate that cultures are not monolithic and can be reified all too easily. Vasalou cites several ancient philosophers in order to illustrate the variety within this culture. This leads to more fundamental questions about the explanatory value of culture. To what extent do we read Aristotle, or al-Ghazali for that matter, as products of their respective historical cultures, and to what extent do we understand them as individuals? Is al-Ghazali's emphasis on knowledge rather than honor in the shaping of social recognition and status a reflection of a greater medieval Islamic estimation of knowledge, for example? Or do such features tell us more about the Sitz im Leben of the respective authors? Does monotheism tend to inspire a greater appreciation of humility and transcendental orientations of moral ambition? What exactly is it in a culture that shapes the way ideas about moral improvement and ambition are expressed in writing? What is the nature of existence that ideas enjoy outside of the cultures that produced them? Studies such as Vasalou's might allow us to address some of these critical issues.