2019.08.02

Valerie Tiberius

Well-Being as Value Fulfillment: How We Can Help Each Other to Live Well,

Valerie Tiberius, Well-Being as Value Fulfillment: How We Can Help Each Other to Live Well, Oxford University Press, 2018, 214pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198809494.

Reviewed by Bernard Reginster, Brown University


"Ethical theories," Valerie Tiberius claims in her opening chapter, "are for solving practical problems. . . . When it comes to well-being, the relevant questions are about what it is for a person's life to go better or worse for them." (8-9) This approach explains the book's focus on friendship -- it vividly brings out the relevant problem -- and suggests a proposed solution: "when we think about how to improve well-being, we ought to focus on people's values." (10) Chapters 2 and 3 develop this proposal, and chapters 4 and 5 examine its application to the case of friendship. There is much to like in Tiberius' perceptive explorations: the quest for well-being -- a friend's or one's own -- can be complicated business, and she carefully develops many thoughtful recommendations to conduct it, well informed by contemporary psychological research on well-being and other relevant matters.

I will not say much about the discussion of friendship because the difficulties Tiberius believes friends must confront in helping each other pursue well-being, while well-taken and well-described, are not unique to the distinctive conception of well-being she develops. How to know enough about the friend and what will make her life go well (the "informational challenge" [114ff.]), how to handle the friend's errors about what makes her life go well (the "interpersonal challenge" [122ff.]), and how to address conflicts between the friend's well-being and one's own (165ff.), are problems that arise, in one way or another, for any conception of well-being. Much of the book's original contribution lies in the distinctive theory of well-being Tiberius offers to our consideration. I will therefore devote the bulk of my discussion to it.

Tiberius calls her theory the value fulfillment theory (hereafter VFT): our lives go well to the extent that we fulfill our values over the long term (34). It is a variant of subjectivism about well-being, or the view that a life goes well for me if it goes well from my point of view: "for something to be good for me it has to be something I can see as good for me." (62) It differs from other forms of subjectivism by making well-being relative to the viewpoint of the person's values. By this, she means the projects, activities, relationships, and ideals that person values. In her analysis, to value something is to be subject to particular desires and feelings with respect to it, and to judge that it is good in some way, so that one has a reason to pursue it and to take it into account in planning and assessing one's life. She rehearses familiar objections to hedonistic and life satisfaction conceptions of well-being, including their difficulties in explaining what is good about well-being and why people have good reasons to pursue it. And she contrasts the VFT with the variety of subjectivism closest to it, desire satisfaction, by noting that people "identify themselves in terms of their values more readily than they do in terms of their desires." This means that values "are just the part of a person's point of view that they take to determine how well their life goes" (45).

Subjectivism allows for error in the pursuit of well-being, but typically only instrumental error: the person falsely believes that a certain kind of life will satisfy her evaluative priorities. It does not allow for substantive error about these values themselves. This does not seem right: a person may care about things that are not good for her. The cases of the happy "grass counter" (82) and of the happy "slave" (95) invite precisely such a diagnosis. It is hard to believe that the life of a person who devotes most of her time to counting blades of grass could actually go well for her, even if she values nothing more (or other) than counting blades of grass. And it is hard to accept that a life of slavery could go well for a person if her valuing it is the product of adaptation to oppressive circumstances. In both cases, the person's life only seems to her to go well, but it really does not because there is something wrong with her values.

The VFT is designed to accommodate this intuition. It concedes that, under certain conditions, the lives of the grass-counter or of the slave could go well for them, but that is not necessarily the case because the theory makes room for the critique of a person's values. To keep with subjectivism, this critique must be internal to the person's system of values (58). Such a critique might bear on the relations among values in the system. For example, a person's obsessive valuation of money or fame might interfere not just with other values, but also with her overall value fulfillment; and she might not value things, such as her health, that are instrumentally necessary for the fulfillment of the values she does have.

The critique might also bear on what Tiberius calls the appropriateness of individual values. A value is appropriate (in part) if it is "suited to our desires and emotions" and "reflectively endorsed" (it must also be "capable of being fulfilled together over time" but I will leave this condition out for now) (41). Conflicts between our desires and feelings and our value judgments do seem to affect our well-being, but how they do so in the VFT is somewhat ambiguous. On the one hand, such a conflict may raise questions about whether, and to what extent, a person values something. If she judges something to be valuable, but does not much want to pursue it or feel much regret if it does not come to pass, one might rightly wonder whether, and to what extent, she really values that thing (39). Thus, a conflict between value judgments and relevant feelings may reveal that our values are not quite what we judge them to be: "we can learn from our feelings that there are things about our well-being of which we were not aware." (46) On the other hand, such a conflict raises questions not about our commitment to these values, but about the prospect of their fulfillment: "we do better at meeting our aims when our emotions, desires, and judgments are more integrated" (38).

This ambiguity is interesting because it raises questions about the precise role the VFT attributes to what we might call emotional fulfillment. In the case just mentioned, the conflict may be less evidence of ambivalence than testament to our ethical frailty: we really value what we judge to be valuable, but our recalcitrant nature makes it impossible for our feelings to accord with that judgment. This suggests that the life of the strong-willed ascetic, who manages to contain her recalcitrant (emotional) nature in following her value judgments, is going well for her. Emotional fulfillment plays here a purely instrumental (and dispensable) role in well-being by facilitating value fulfillment. The life of the conflicted person could go well for her so long as her recalcitrant emotions do not interfere with her value fulfillment. Some might find this conclusion jarring: how could a person's life go well for her if it conflicts with desires and feelings rooted in her very nature? We avoid this conclusion if we suppose that our feelings are the basis of our values, so that we can "learn" from them what we care about. In that case, what seems to matter to well-being is emotional fulfillment, and value fulfillment insofar as our values express (or at least jibe with) our emotional nature.

A case Tiberius mentions (but does not discuss in detail) suggests that emotional fulfillment might matter to well-being even independently of value fulfillment. Consider the person who "finds no value in anything" as a consequence of "depression" (34-5, 69). Intuitively, the life of a depressive does not go well for her. But it is not clear how the VFT would accommodate this intuition. If the person truly cares about nothing, then she does not care about that either. In the absence of values, to be sure, there is no sense in which her life could go well for her. But to insist, as Tiberius does, that her life goes "badly" for her appears to violate the strictures of the theory, since it makes her well-being depend on facts that transcend her evaluative perspective. Not implausibly, perhaps, her life goes badly because her emotional nature -- which arguably includes a basic need to care for something -- remains unfulfilled.

The VFT concedes to objectivist approaches to well-being that a person can be substantively wrong about whether or not her life is going well. But it remains subjectivist nonetheless, insofar as well-being is a function not of the things that happen to her but of the attitude she takes toward them -- they must be things she values, or comes to value. She might be in error about what she currently values, or might come to value in the future since, as Tiberius notes, "values develop." (37) Her priorities might change, and she might even undergo "transformative experiences," which alter her evaluative perspective in substantive ways (e.g., having children appears to do so for some people).

Tiberius exploits this notion of overall, long-term value fulfillment to address another standard problem for subjectivist approaches to well-being: the problem of self-sacrifice. When Dahlia (Tiberius' example) devotes all her time and resources to fighting climate change at the expense of her other values, she intuitively appears to sacrifice her well-being to a moral cause. Tiberius acknowledges the force of this intuition: "moral sacrifice," she writes, "should not be made conceptually impossible by a theory of well-being." (42) The problem is that, if Dahlia's own evaluative priorities determine what sort of life makes her best off, and her priority is the moral cause, then her devotion to it is no self-sacrifice. It is, Tiberius argues, if we construe her devotion as giving up overall, long-term value fulfillment for the sake of what she "values most at the moment."

This is a tantalizing move but I am not sure I see how, in the context of the VFT, it solves the problem. To count as self-sacrifice, an act must meet certain conditions. Obviously, it must be an act that makes the agent worse off. However, an ill-considered act, whose harmful consequences result from ignorance, is not self-sacrificial. So, the act must also be done in the knowledge that it makes her worse off. But weak-willed acts done in the knowledge of their harmful consequences are not self-sacrificial either. This invites the supposition that self-sacrifice is an act in which the agent sacrifices her well-being for the sake of something else she considers more important. Is there conceptual room for such a possibility in the VFT?

The typical predicament of self-sacrifice is one in which a person faces a choice between what is in her best interest and what is good in some other way. But it is not clear whether the VFT can allow for this distinction. In its terms, my best interest at a given time is determined by the respective force of the claims made on me by my various values in the circumstances in which I find myself (including perhaps reasonable predictions about what I might come to value in the future). Not to act in my best interest, then, is simply to act irrationally, for it implies failing to take into proper account the claims of (some of) my values. And self-sacrifice is presumably not an irrational act.

Consider again Dahlia's case. The constraints of her circumstances and the multiplicity of her values require her to make compromises and even trade-offs. Some of her values are more important than others, and in particularly pressing circumstances, they might compel her to discount or even renounce some of her less important values. Dahlia's devotion seems to be just that kind of difficult choice. She gives up on long-term value fulfillment, to be sure, but, as Tiberius observes, this is not necessarily sacrificing her well-being since taking the long-term perspective "does not mean 'the longer the better'" (54). That depends on the values to be fulfilled: the urgency of climate change and Dahlia's moral values might be such that she simply could not live with herself -- let alone live well -- if she did not devote all of her present resources to fighting against it. Under these circumstances, her exclusive devotion appears to shape a "life as rich in value fulfillment as could be." She might be wrong about this -- she could learn to live with herself -- but that is not sufficient to qualify her devotion as self-sacrifice. And the fact that her devotion is motivated by moral considerations, rather than by self-interest, can obviously not suffice to make it self-sacrificial either. As Tiberius notes for the case of friendship, fulfilling my values is often in my best interest only insofar as my caring for the valued object is not motivated by a concern with my well-being (99, 140).

I suspect that Tiberius' value fulfillment theory has resources to answer many of these questions, which more judicious readers will identify. In any event, her explicit aim is not to establish the superiority of that theory over existing competing theories, but to show that it deserves consideration. In this regard, her book is fully successful. Moreover, as I noted at the beginning, the book's richness also resides in the practical wisdom it imparts, much of which I regrettably could not consider here.