A Brief History of Justice

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David Johnston, A Brief History of Justice, Wiley-Blackwell, 2011, 265pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405155779

Reviewed by Christopher McMahon, University of California, Santa Barbara


This book presents a historical overview of thinking about justice in the West from ancient times to the present. Justice in the ancient world is explained as grounded in the concept of reciprocity, and Johnston argues that the history of justice in the West can be understood as a history of changes in, and challenges to, the idea of justice as reciprocity.

Johnston begins his discussion of justice in the ancient world by making a distinction between balanced and unbalanced reciprocity. The account of justice that he presents presupposes the concept of the "terrain" of a society, understood as the existing framework of social cooperation. The terrain in the ancient world was hierarchical, and ancient thought about justice accepted hierarchy as an aspect of the natural order, which thinking about justice had to accommodate. Between equals -- primarily, members of the elite -- reciprocity was balanced. It required returning good for good and bad for bad in equal measure. Between unequals, reciprocity was "tilted" in favor of higher status individuals. In the distribution of benefits, it was appropriate for higher status individuals to receive larger shares, and in the assignment of punishments, it was appropriate for lower status individuals to suffer greater pains. But justice still encompassed all the members of the society, giving them claims to receive what was due to them as occupants of their stations. So there was a sense in which justice protected the weak.

The initial chapter explores justice in societies that pre-dated classical Greece. Separate chapters are then devoted to Plato and Aristotle. Plato in the Republic is described as the great dissenter from the idea that justice requires reciprocity. Justice is rather a matter of command and obedience, in particular the obedience of the inferior elements in any complex by the superior. The obedience of the impulsive parts of the soul to the rational parts is taken as a model for justice in the political arena. With Aristotle, thinking about justice returned to the concept of reciprocity. Johnston supports this claim by arguing that the familiar Aristotelian discussions of distributive and corrective justice in Book V of the Nicomachean Ethics actually presuppose the often overlooked discussion of reciprocity in that book.

Johnston summarizes the view of justice that obtained in the ancient world as grounded in three assumptions. First, the scope of the concept of justice was confined to the polis. Justice did not regulate relations with outsiders. Second, humans were taken to be, by nature, unequal in their capacities, with the result that it was appropriate for them to occupy for life different functionally specified roles associated with different claims. And finally, it was assumed that the polis itself had a telos, a natural form that it sought to realize. Subsequent thinking about justice in the West is described as moving away from all these assumptions.

The first change was effected by the Stoics, who introduced the idea of universal justice, the idea that the concept of justice applies to relations among all human beings. Other trends, augmented by Christianity, chipped away at the idea of unequal status dictated by nature. Johnston presents these trends as reaching a new plateau in the work of Hobbes, who posited both that humans are, in an important sense, equal by nature and that they possess, equally, certain natural rights. Hobbesian thought was also characterized by the introduction of the idea that the social order is not a natural given but rather something that is constructed. This marked a fundamental transformation of thinking about justice. Rather than governing relations between people whose position in a fixed social terrain is set by nature, justice came to be applied to the terrain itself. As Johnston puts it, a new question emerged: "How can human beings redesign and rebuild the terrain of the social world so as to make that terrain itself just" (115).

The next stage involved the concept of utility. Johnston construes the notion broadly. The main idea is that the organization of political cooperation is to be guided by a concern to promote human well-being, with everyone's well-being counting equally. Thus, for Hume, conventions of property are understood to have their rationale in the promotion of human well-being. Similarly, Adam Smith's invisible hand was significant because its operation brought greater prosperity. Johnston emphasizes that these writers were responding to the poverty that was endemic in their societies.

But Smith's idea is presented as possessing significance of a broader sort. The operation of the invisible hand presupposes the division of labor, and this blurs the boundaries of contribution to the overall social product. What each is able to contribute is determined by the contribution of others. This has the effect of calling into question the "contribution principle" associated with balanced reciprocity -- the principle that distributive shares should be proportional to contribution. A similar effect was produced by the emergence, in the work of Beccaria, of the idea that corrective justice should be understood as possessing a deterrence, in contrast to a retributive, rationale. Justice, understood as the appropriate distribution of benefits and burdens from political cooperation, was thus provided with a consequentialist foundation.

The next figure to attract Johnston's attention is Kant. With Kant, the idea of reciprocity returns to the fore. Public right is grounded in a contract among noumenal persons that establishes a collective will, and the contractually specified relations are reciprocal. Further, the idea of an original contract among noumenal persons provides a criterion by which the justice of particular laws can be tested. A law is just only if the contractors could have agreed to it. Johnston notes that in the domain of public right, the resulting reciprocity was not exactly balanced. The well-off were required to pay taxes to support the needy. But it may be that this imbalance can be treated as an empirical matter. At the noumenal level, the reciprocity can still be understood as balanced because a noumenal self could be in any empirical position. This may also be what Johnston has in mind when he says that Kant's view can be seen as reconciling the concept of reciprocity with the fact that where there is a division of labor, it is difficult to distinguish contributions. The difficulty is an empirical matter, while reciprocity is a relation among noumenal selves.

These developments set the stage for the emergence of the idea of social justice -- the idea that a whole society, in contrast to relations among particular persons, can be seen as just or unjust. Johnston associates this development initially with the French revolution, and he characterizes it as taking two contrasting forms in the nineteenth century. The first emphasized desert. As formulated by Herbert Spencer, it held that

A society is just if (1) its members are equal insofar as each is guaranteed freedom within a sphere of action limited by like spheres for others; and (2) the good and evil consequences that flow to its members are equivalent in value to the good and/or harmful consequences they cause (179).

Aristocracy, with its inherited claims unrelated to contribution, thus becomes unjust. The social device that ensures the satisfaction of the second condition is the free market. This seems to involve a rejection of the idea that where there is a division of labor, it is impossible to allocate benefits on the basis of the principle of contribution. Genuinely free markets can be understood as an institutional device that makes it possible to correlate benefit received with contribution made, and thus to establish what people deserve.

The second form that thinking about social justice took in the nineteenth century involved a principle not of desert, but of need. Marx is an important figure here. Marx was skeptical about the concept of justice because he associated it with the desert principle, which he regarded as bringing with it inequality. But in the "Critique of the Gotha Program," he claims that under communism, distribution will be governed by need.

Johnston argues that neither the desert principle nor the need principle is adequate by itself. The desert principle suffers from the fact that what is really at issue is entitlement, given the conventions of the existing social "game." So the principle does not provide a basis for radical criticism of the game. The principle also has the problem that, under it, many people would get little or nothing because they have nothing to contribute that the market wants. The need principle addresses this problem, but suffers from the drawback that even if we understand a person's needs as determined by what is required to live a life of dignity and respect, under modern conditions of production, people's needs can be met with a relatively small part of the social product. Thus some other principle of distribution is required for the remainder. Johnston says that writers in the "need" camp turned to equality for this purpose. After everyone's needs are met, the remainder of the social product should be distributed in equal shares. But he suggests that this is not psychologically realistic. The most productive members will find it difficult to accept that their labors will receive no proportional reward at all.

The final theory of justice that Johnston discusses is Rawls's theory of justice as fairness. The key assumption of this theory is that society is to be viewed as a fair system of cooperation among free and equal persons. The discussion of Rawls is mainly expository, so most of what Johnston says will be familiar to the readers of this journal. He does suggest, however, that there is a tension between the idea that the basic structure is the primary subject of justice, which Rawls defends on the ground of the profound effect that the basic structure has on opportunities, and the difference principle, which focuses rather on outcomes.

Johnston's main criticism of Rawls relates to the idea that the two principles of social justice are intellectually prior to, and serve as a foundation for, thinking about justice in all areas of economic life. Johnston regards the concept of balanced reciprocity as having an independent role to play. So where there is a clash between this concept and the difference principle, as their might be when collective bargaining produces a mutually acceptable wage settlement in a particular corporation, we must be prepared to strike a balance.

The fact that virtually all our skills and all our wealth are social products need not compel us to discard the concept of desert from the repertoire of ideas to which we can turn to understand problems of justice, but it does give us good reasons to reject the principle of desert as the fundamental principle of social justice (224).

Johnston's basic conclusion, after completing his historical survey, is that justice is grounded, ultimately, in a sense of justice, a psychological capacity that is possessed by normal humans, and that this capacity is oriented toward balanced reciprocity. At the beginning of the book he says, by way of anticipation, that

the idea of justice is a tool that has been invented and refined by human beings, but, like other tools, it is not infinitely plastic and cannot be reinvented in any form one happens to like, at least if we want to do the kind of work that the idea of justice was brought into being to do (4).

Theorizing about justice is thus constrained by the need to maintain a connection of some kind with balanced reciprocity.

Johnston relates this point to the issue of global justice. A focus on the division of the social product, he says, blinds us to global injustice. There is no discussion of current work on global justice -- the contrast between cosmopolitan and statist views, for example. His argument that justice as reciprocity has something to say about global justice seems to be grounded in the idea that relations between political entities, especially states, have been insufficiently informed by balanced reciprocity.

Johnston's overview of the history of thinking about justice in the West reveals a number of features of this thinking that are obscured in most contemporary discussions of justice, which take as their point of departure Rawls's theory of justice. In that sense, it constitutes a useful corrective to a certain myopia in current political philosophy. But the focus on reciprocity leaves an important question unanswered, namely, the question of what distinguishes justice from fairness. Fairness, too, can be seen as a matter of balanced reciprocity.

One possibility is that justice enters the picture when reciprocity is, or ought to be, achieved by an exercise of authority. Thus the distribution of benefits and burdens in a group of people on a camping trip raises issues of fairness, not justice. But I might say that someone who breaks a promise made to me does me an injustice. Here the key seems to be the existence of an antecedently established claim. So perhaps the best way to understand the distinction between justice and fairness is by reference to a claim, or framework of claims, taken to be antecedently established. Talk of justice involves such reference, while talk of fairness need not. The concept of fairness is thus especially well suited to contexts where we take ourselves to be negotiating what reciprocity requires. The connection of justice with authority would then enter by virtue of the fact that the claims that can be made in different contexts are often fixed by an exercise of authority. So in thinking about how authority ought to be exercised, we are thinking about justice.