A Brief History of Liberty

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David Schmidtz and Jason Brennan, A Brief History of Liberty, Wiley-Blackwell, 2010, 267pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405170796.

Reviewed by Michael Clifford, Mississippi State University


Writing a history of liberty is a daunting task that has challenged even the most indefatigable of scholars, but it is one certainly worthy of the effort. “Liberty is not a means to a higher end, it is itself the highest political end,” wrote Lord Acton in History of Freedom and Other essays, originally published in 1907, five years after his death. Acton had intended to write a multi-volumed, comprehensive History of Liberty, but the sheer enormity of the project led to his resignation that it was “impossible of achievement.” (The project has since been taken up by the Acton Institute.) Before Acton, the challenge of writing such a history had been attempted, with varying degrees of success by others, including Voltaire, Hegel, and Samuel Eliot, whose two volume History of Liberty, published in 1853, documented the historical movement toward a freedom inhibited by “heathens.” Since Acton, we might include Hayek’s The Constitution of Liberty (1960) and John Danford’s Roots of Freedom: a Primer on Modern Liberty (2000). However, none of these writers suffered from the illusion that an adequate history of liberty could in any way be “brief.”

Nevertheless, that is precisely (with dutiful apologies and caveats, of course) what the authors, David Schmidtz and Jason Brennan, attempt to accomplish in A Brief History of Liberty. One of Wiley-Blackwell’s A Brief History of … series, this book is a set of reflections on liberty — understood as "personal freedom’ — generated, at least in part, at the University of Arizona Center for Philosophy of Freedom, although it is not entirely clear for whom this book is written or at what level of academic engagement. It consists of an introduction and six chapters, each of which begins with a “thesis” and concludes with discussion questions, except for Chapter 1, on the “pre-history” of liberty, which oddly lacks the discussion questions. These questions are thoughtful and thought-provoking.

The Introduction begins with the thesis: There are several forms of liberty. Whether they are conflicting or complementary is a matter of historical circumstance.

The authors claim that this is "a history of liberty, not a history of theorizing about liberty," (1) but the distinction is not immediately clear or adequately exposited. In fact, any view of what liberty really is presupposes a theoretical model about how to interpret any given state of political affairs, which is itself controversial and problematic. The introduction then proceeds to attempt to “clarify” the matter by considering a number of (unapologetically Western, mostly traditional liberal) theories of liberty, ranging from Hobbes to Pettit, focusing on the distinction between negative and positive freedom. This overly schematic analysis ultimately concludes with the assertion that negative and positive freedoms are not really at odds with one another, and in fact are mutually supportive. The authors attempt to sidestep the theoretical conflict, however, by stating, "This book’s overall purpose is to tell a story of liberty, and to tell it briefly, not to argue for liberty or for any particular way of defining the term ‘liberty.’" (18)

This conceit in many ways structures the entire book. In point of fact, however, the authors appeal to a rather narrow, Western ethnocentric, even Whiggish definition of liberty: “We concentrate on liberty in its individual forms,” (5), as opposed, for example, to a quasi-Marxist communal idea of freedom, wherein “real” liberty is largely a history of generating "more real choice" for the individual, through the rule of law and economic “progress,” both of which “free” the individual from the Hobbesian state of nature and its attendant inconveniences.

Chapter One ,“A Prehistory of Liberty: Forty Thousand Years Ago,” begins with the thesis: The greatest threat to and best hope for a better life, in the long run, comes from other human beings. Historically, trade has been a great liberator. (30) Appealing to an almost cartoonish anthropological comparison of Neanderthals and Homo sapiens, the authors assert that the former suffered extinction because they lacked the latter’s “evolving propensity to truck and barter.” (31) From this they extrapolate a conclusion that is a central theme of the book: that liberty depends on commerce! The Neanderthals died out because “they were not entrepreneurs,” say the authors, whereas the precursors to modern man, these prehistoric Donald Trumps, flourished precisely because they engaged in trade with other humans. This in turn facilitated the development of speech and language, and eventually the sort of “rudimentary rule of law” necessary to govern their transactions, which would lay the groundwork for the sort of constitutional rights upon which our liberty is based and preserved.

There are at least two major problems with this analysis, as I see it. First, the authors provide no real baseline to what it is to be unfree. They seem to assume some Hobbesian state of existence wherein the lack of liberty is identified with the difficulties attending basic survival, difficulties which are relieved through commerce. But, the claim in the thesis that trade has been a “great liberator” is easily undermined by the observation that it has been a great enslaver as well, that the so-called liberties of capitalist regimes are precisely those that serve its perpetuation (Marxist concerns in this vein are cursorily dismissed by the authors; post-structuralist analyses of capitalist exploitation and disenfranchisement, such as Jameson, Deleuze, Baudrillard, Irigaray, and others are not even considered). The authors simply take it as a given that prehistorical peoples were unfree and that true liberty is achieved through economic progress. Without a more adequate baseline definition of freedom/lack of freedom, these assertions are unpersuasive. Moreover, and this leads to the second, related problem, why should we assume an identity or even causal correlation between liberty and commerce? Many non-Western perspectives see the two as largely antithetical to each other. In Ancient Futures, Norberg-Hodge observes,

I used to assume that the direction of ‘progress’ was somehow inevitable, not to be questioned… . I do not anymore. Community and a close relationship with the land can enrich human life beyond all comparison with material wealth or technological sophistication.

I mention this counter-view not in advocacy, but to suggest that both views are naïve if they assume that something as complex, ephemeral, and institutionally-contingent as liberty can be achieved under either scenario. In fact, it is not clear what liberty even means in either context.

In any event, this Whiggish and uncritical identification of liberty with economic progress continues in chapter two on “The Rule of Law: AD 1075.” The thesis for this chapter is, The evolution of the rule of law provided the essential foundation for the explosive economic progress of recent centuries that liberated the West from extreme poverty. This chapter traces the rise of liberty from feudalism to the Magna Carta, ascribing it to the usurping of capricious ecclesiastical and monarchical governance by various constitutional constraints underpinning the rule of law. Chapter 3 does something similar with regard to religious freedom. The discussions are persuasive, given the point of view, and, although schematic, a student can learn much from it. I found the discussion of the under-appreciated Grotius to be particularly informative.

Chapter 4, “Freedom of Commerce: 1776,” begins with a thesis which states, in part, Freedom of commerce under the rule of law empowers people to cooperate on a massive scale, liberating each other from poverty. The chapter begins with an anecdote about Nixon showing a model of a typical American home to Krushchev in 1959. Krushchev was incredulous. Citing the episode is a transparent attempt by the authors to suggest that American prosperity is the real measure both of freedom and, interchangeably, capitalist superiority over the Soviet model. The chapter then goes on to cite a vast range of statistical evidence on economic expansion since 1900, on farming and food production, steel manufacturing and the rise of factories, advances in medicine, automobiles, skyscrapers, all of the modern innovations and conveniences of so-called “friendly societies” built upon a market economy. (125) At one point the authors even claim that “the market produces” Mozart and Beethoven (along with, they grudgingly admit, Britney Spears)! In short, free trade is the engine behind our personal freedoms and the culture in which it thrives. The rule of law allows these freedoms to be exercised in a productive manner. Property rights aren’t simply inalienable entitlements, but the grease for capitalist innovation.

There are so many things wrong with this chapter that I don’t know where to start. With the simple-minded equation of rising wages to quality of life? With the casual dismissal of the Third-World worker and resource exploitation that helps to support First-World standards of living? The fact that in so-called prosperous societies like ours, the poor suffer more from obesity and early-onset diabetes than from malnutrition or starvation? The authors are so sanguine about the connection between personal freedom and commercial prosperity that they seem to be advocating a kind of economic neo-imperialism. They would do well to read a recent study by Anand Giridharadas on the effects of exporting the Western market model. When the first McDonalds restaurants appeared in India, customers literally fought with each other to place orders. Eventually, they were persuaded to form lines. However, line-jumping was so prevalent that customers were forced to press their bodies tightly against each other. Giridharadas extrapolates from that experience to cast serious doubts upon the alleged connection between freedom and so-called economic progress. To generalize, following the Hobbesian model, we move from a state of nature — Giridharadas refers to it as a “scrum” — to the rule of law that governs how we interact with each other. The rule of law turns the scrum into formal lines, a metaphor for equality of opportunity; everyone has to wait their turn. But a market economy creates market exemptions, i.e., those who have the resources to pay to get ahead of / out of the line. The line represents equality, presumably, but does it represent true liberty or merely freedom from the scrum? Freedom to queue up, to follow orders for the sake of order, to adopt a passive posture of submission to a market regime that determines your desires, your needs, your very identity. And what kind of freedom is that when measured against those “free” to escape the lines altogether? The promise of the capitalist axiom defended by the authors is that we all, potentially, at least, can achieve the market exemption. But the logic of that axiom suggests otherwise, and even if it were possible, would that not push us toward a new form of scrum, as we have seen on Wall Street recently and in the “Wild West” of Russian capitalism?

The thesis for Chapter 5, “Civil Liberty: 1954,” is: The security of civil rights, and ultimately liberal society within the rule of law, depend both on a culture of freedom and individualism, and on individual heroic catalysts. Here the “cult of the individual” that animates the entire book becomes explicit. This chapter is dedicated to the heroic exploits of such champions of freedom as Thomas Jefferson, Booker T. Washington, W. E. B. DuBois, Thurgood Marshall, and, of course, Rosa Parks, with a passing wave at feminists and gay rights advocates. Here again the discussion appeals to an uncritical notion of autonomous individuality, a Cartesian subject who gradually, with heroic perseverance, achieves his or her freedom. There is no acknowledgement, or even apparent awareness, of the fact that scholars such as Foucault have long argued that the “individual” is not a metaphysical given, but a historically-contingent construct, whose emergence coincides with the idea of liberty and rights, in service of a power regime to which its very existence is bound.

The final chapter, “Psychological Freedom, the Last Frontier: 1963,” continues this characterization of personal freedom as an “achievement”: “Freedom of the will is not an on/off switch, something you have or not. Instead, real-world freedom of the will is an on-going achievement” (212).

Here, the authors turn inward; the “shackles” that the individual must overcome to achieve freedom are psychological, such as social pressure (citing the well-worn Milgram electric-shock experiments), self-deception, confabulation, discontent (the grass is always greener syndrome), and even the “dearth of shackles” (paralysis caused by having too much choice). (228) The underlying metaphysical questions never get sorted out, so it is unclear exactly what is being shackled. Is it the self-deluded Cartesian subject impeded by her own will, or is it the “achievement” of freedom that is (or at least could be) the self? In any event, the entire chapter is tangential at best, and arguably rests on an equivocation of the word “freedom.” For my money, it seems out of place in a study of political liberty.

To conclude, I could recommend this book for a seminar (either early graduate or high undergraduate) in which the professor uses it with some critical distance, as a point of departure for more sophisticated treatments. The book weaves together a number of figures in social, political, philosophical, economic, and even psychological theory, in a way not commonly found, and it does so rather effectively, if one accepts the narrow, quasi-libertarian emphasis on the individual and the apologetics of freedom as tied to economic progress. The language is engaging and accessible. The book could replace a number of disparate texts, especially if one is keen on focusing on the emergence and development of the idea of freedom in the Liberal Tradition; but I think, overall, the book succeeds better as a brief history of the rule of law. There is no guarantee that the rule of law engenders personal freedom; on the contrary. Nonetheless, we can agree with the authors that it appears to be a necessary, though far from sufficient condition for it, and it is certainly worthwhile to explore the ways that the two ideas — personal liberty and the rule of law — have emerged together and given shape to the institutions of modern politics.