A Common Law Theory of Judicial Review: The Living Tree

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W.J. Waluchow, A Common Law Theory of Judicial Review: The Living Tree, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 296pp., $88.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521864763.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Brand-Ballard, George Washington University



In representative democracies, you have the right to petition your lawmakers to change a law of which you disapprove. If they fail to do so, you can vote against them. In some democracies, you have an additional option. You can challenge the law in court (provided you have legal standing to do so), arguing that it conflicts with fundamental law: the constitution or Charter. The process by which courts adjudicate such challenges is known as "judicial review." Some democracies, such as Canada, Israel, Germany, and the USA, have judicial review. Others, such as Great Britain, France, and New Zealand, do not. Thousands of articles and hundreds of books have been written about judicial review by scholars in law, philosophy, and the social sciences. Three basic normative questions are: (1) is judicial review a politically legitimate institution? (2) is judicial review a desirable institution for a representative democracy? (3) what methodology of judicial review should courts use?

W.J. Waluchow's new book addresses all of these questions. He defends judicial review as both legitimate and desirable in a democracy. He argues that courts should implement the Charter (his preferred term) using a common law method, rather than limiting themselves to the original meaning of the Charter or the intentions of its framers. Previous writers have drawn parallels between constitutional adjudication and common law reasoning (Strauss, 1996; Schauer, 1989; Farber and Sherry, 2002), but this appears to be the first published monograph devoted to defending a common law method of judicial review (but see Stoner, 2003; Strauss, forthcoming).

Legal philosophers know Waluchow for his articles on positivism and for his (1994) monograph, which remains the most important book-length defense of the position known as "inclusive positivism." Inclusive positivists hold that legal systems could, possibly, specify standards of political morality as criteria of legal validity and content. Waluchow's inclusive positivism informs his new book, which has many virtues. It is well organized and clearly written, with little technical jargon. It is full of sensible, straightforward arguments. It provides a useful overview of some of the basic theoretical issues surrounding judicial review. The book could be assigned to advanced undergraduates with no background in either law or philosophy.

The book also stands out from most books on judicial review in its focus on the Canadian Charter of Rights and Freedoms and its engagement with Canadian critics of judicial review, such as F.L. Morton, Rainer Knopff, and Michael Mandel. Waluchow also references the U.S. Constitution and American scholars, but his concentration on Canada is a welcome corrective to the insularity of constitutional scholarship in the USA.

In this review, I shall summarize the book and express some reservations.


The book consists of six chapters, the first of which is an introduction.[1] In Chapter 2, Waluchow discusses various institutional mechanisms available to constitutional democracies. Anticipating the charge that judicial review is undemocratic, Waluchow explains that, in all but direct democracies, law-determining decisions are "distanced" from citizens in various ways. (17) Even elected legislators are not required to vote their constituents' opinions, and modern democracies contain administrative agencies and unelected bodies that create still greater distance between citizens and law-making. Constitutional limitations on government are yet another distancing mechanism, a point developed with helpful references to Locke, Hobbes, and John Austin.

Waluchow recognizes, however, that constitutional limitations need not take the form of a Charter that is either written or entrenched (i.e., more difficult to change than is ordinary legislation). Nor is separation of powers either conceptually or practically necessary. Nevertheless, separation of powers is desirable in many societies, as is an entrenched, written Charter. The chapter concludes with an overview of five theories of constitutional interpretation. The first three, which Waluchow classifies as "fixed views," are original meaning, original intent, and hypothetical intent. The remaining two theories are Dworkinian constructive interpretation and critical theory.

The stage is now set for the basic questions raised in Chapter 3: "Why, among the numerous possibilities open to it, would a democratic society choose a system of government in which the powers of government are limited by an entrenched, written Charter of Rights?" (75) And why would such a society assign the judiciary, in particular, the task of applying this Charter? Waluchow presents what he calls the "Standard Case" for Charters, supported by the "Advocates." Speaking for the Advocates, Waluchow analogizes judicial review to advocacy in the best interests of a patient whose judgment is temporarily impaired: the electorate is like a patient whose true interests and values the court represents, over her protest. Majorities sometimes favor legislation that oppresses minorities, but when they do so, the Advocates assure us, they are "drunk with fear" (112), in the grip of "temporarily ascendant" (90) but "inauthentic" preferences. Because unelected judges are insulated from political pressure, they are more likely to override these inauthentic preferences in favor of the "authentic" preferences of the majority which are, Waluchow believes, always to treat minorities fairly. (118) The Standard Case is most easily made using a "constitutional conception" of democracy, which defines democracy as a system that "respects the equal status of all members of the community," but it also holds on a "procedural conception" of democracy. (106-09)

In Chapter 4, Waluchow turns to the Critics' case against judicial review. His main adversary is Jeremy Waldron (1999a; 1999b), a liberal whom Waluchow sees as the most persuasive Critic. (217) Waldron and other Critics advance several objections to Charters. Charters, they claim, compromise the ideals of democratic self-government. Charters permit the dead hand of the past to rule the present. They depend upon the fiction of substantial consensus about individual rights in modern, pluralistic societies. They presuppose that there are objectively correct answers to moral questions, and that judges have better moral judgment than the rest of us. Charters are also said to presuppose an incoherent picture of human agents, according to which the same individuals who must be respected for their autonomy and responsibility also have a "predatory" nature which leads them to oppress one another in the realm of ordinary politics. Finally, according to the Critics, Charters frustrate political compromise by encouraging "rights talk," in which ordinary interests are elevated to "trumps" over the common good.

Waluchow acknowledges that many of these objections have some merit, but he finds them overstated. He presents several cogent responses in Chapter 4, but his main line of response, in Chapters 5 and 6, challenges two premises accepted by both Advocates and Critics. The first is that "there are 'objective' truths, concerning, for example, political morality, what the framers intended, or the Charter's plain or original meaning, which an impartial, morally neutral judiciary is capable of discerning and drawing upon in making Charter decisions." The second is that "Charters aspire to entrench the rights these truths describe or establish, as fixed points of agreement on and commitment to moral limits on government power." (180) Waluchow rejects both of these premises. He defends judicial review as a response to our inability to know, in advance, what political morality requires.

Waluchow notes, following H.L.A. Hart, that one effect of introducing secondary rules into society is that acceptance and validity can diverge. (192) This separation creates the possibility of decisions that are legally valid but unacceptable because they conflict with the community's moral commitments. Anticipating this possibility, legislators take advantage of the open texture of language, drafting legal standards with terms such as "reasonable" and "fair" and delegating to judges the task of application. (196)

Common law methodology represents another way of dealing with the possibility of conflict. Several features of common law reasoning distinguish it from reasoning in cases regulated by statutes. Unlike statutory rules, common law rules are not canonically formulated or enacted by legislatures. Also, a court creates and applies common law rules in the process of resolving particular cases. Where an existing rule would lead to an undesirable result in the present case, the court may modify or replace the rule so as to avoid that result.[2] (197-99)

Common law methodology enables legal systems to strike a balance between two important values that are in tension: "fixity" and "adaptability." (204) Waluchow argues that courts engaged in judicial review should, and do, use the common law method as well. He proposes "mapping common law methodology onto the understanding and development of the moral concepts, principles, and values enshrined in Charters." (204) He claims that "the abstract moral terms found within Charters make reference to concepts, like 'equality before and under the law,' whose understanding and development are analogous to the development of concepts like 'negligence,' 'reasonable,' and 'foreseeable' in tort law," a traditional department of the common law. (204) The drafters of the Charter value equality, for example, but they also know that their own understanding of what equality requires in particular cases is imperfect. Rather than specifying in the Charter precisely what legislation equality permits and requires, they use "very abstract terminology" (214) such as "equality" and "fundamental justice." Judges in each generation are given the task of determining what these abstract terms mean with reference to the community's contemporary constitutional morality. The Framers of a Charter cannot predict all of the ways in which general legislation might, in the future, infringe individual rights. Waluchow argues that limited foresight justifies using abstract language and the common law method, rather than concrete language and an originalist method. Suppose the State of Iowa adopts legislation that bans political discourse via email. If the U.S. Constitution contained a provision stating that the terms "speech" and "press" denoted only spoken words and ink on paper, then the courts would have to uphold Iowa's law.[3] Better to leave these terms for future generations to define.


Having ignored many elements of Waluchow's rich study, I now turn to some features of his position that puzzle me. Waluchow knows that many important cases of judicial review do not involve new legislation or new technologies or communities temporarily "drunk" with unanticipated fears. Segregated schools and other public facilities existed in the USA when the Fourteenth Amendment was ratified. So did state statutes criminalizing abortion and sodomy. Capital punishment was in force when the Eighth Amendment was ratified. Prosecutors could use unlawfully obtained evidence at the birth of the Fourth Amendment. These laws were not new developments at all, much less developments that the men of the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries failed to foresee. We must, therefore, consider cases in which a court uses a particular Charter provision to invalidate a law that was already in effect when the provision was enacted, that was endorsed by the framers of that provision, and that has been continuously supported by most of the electorate. Waluchow has no objection to invalidating such laws because he believes that the Charter itself literally changes over time, tracking changes in the "community's constitutional morality." These changes often occur gradually and are rarely reflected in formal amendments to the text of the Charter. In fact, according to Waluchow, these changes in the community's constitutional morality often occur before the community itself has realized it. When the U.S. Supreme Court overturned school segregation in 1954, there was nothing approaching a national consensus in support of the conclusion that segregation violated the community's constitutional morality. Nor was there great public support for the conclusion that the Constitution guaranteed a right to abortion in 1973. The same could be said about capital punishment in 1972, sodomy in 1986, and the use of unlawfully obtained evidence against criminal defendants in 1961.[4]

Realizing this, perhaps, Waluchow explicitly rejects the view that judges should apply the community's constitutional morality as the members of the community themselves would apply it. Rather, he claims that judges are not just permitted, but legally required by their Charter, to "enforce their own views of the community's constitutional morality against the erroneous beliefs of the community and its legislative representatives." (219) Judges are to filter the moral judgments of the community, using the process of reflective equilibrium. (223) Waluchow insists that, in so doing, judges are not imposing their own, subjective moral views. (220) His recurring example involves same-sex marriages. He acknowledges that most Canadians still oppose these marriages, but he insists that their opinions "flatly contradict fundamental beliefs, principles, values, and considered judgments that enjoy widespread, if not universal, currency within the community." (224-25) Many Canadians "do not … see this connection and will perhaps not do so unless it is pointed out to them by some other party, perhaps the Supreme Court in a landmark ruling." (225) In other words, Canadians are already committed to constitutional principles that legitimize same-sex unions, they just have not realized it yet.[5]

This claim raises a new question: if the problem is merely that Canadians have not yet realized that their own values actually support same-sex unions, then the Supreme Court could simply explain this connection to them in a non-binding obiter dictum or advisory opinion. There would be no need for the Court to overturn legislation. But Waluchow would not be satisfied with such non-binding declarations. He wants courts to mandate same-sex marriage. But he also insists that, in so doing, the courts are simply enforcing the community's own constitutional morality -- its authentic moral commitments, not its expressed "opinions." (223) How plausible is this claim? He may be correct that even the opponents of same-sex marriage are committed to certain moral principles of equal concern and respect. (246) But they appear to be committed to versions of these principles that are qualified in such a way as not to entail state recognition for same-sex marriages. Waluchow does not explain why he imputes to the community stronger versions of these principles. His repeated insistence that failure to extend marriage to same-sex couples is "inconsistent" with such principles is surprising because common law reasoning readily accommodates unprincipled exceptions and ad hoc compromises. It proceeds analogically, without requiring deep moral justifications for the distinctions it draws. It thus seems tailor-made for those who wish to treat same-sex couples differently than opposite-sex couples without having to give a full moral justification for discriminating. Waluchow champions "bottom-up" legal reasoning, but his moral reasoning remains curiously "top-down."

Waluchow also suggests that legislatures are too busy to address every Charter case that arises. (263-64) This is true, but irrelevant. The problem could be solved by granting courts the authority to decide Charter cases, subject to override by simple legislative majority. In Canada, the Notwithstanding Clause actually permits a qualified form of this override, although its use is, apparently, disfavored. It is not clear, moreover, that this argument of Waluchow's supports the stronger form of judicial review found in the USA, wherein constitutional decisions by the U.S. Supreme Court can be overturned only by constitutional amendment. Perhaps he never intended to defend American judicial review, but he might have said so explicitly, as his book then loses some interest for American readers.


Waluchow has taken an awkward position. He is strongly committed to the notion that judicial review should enforce nothing but the community's constitutional morality, rather than ideal morality or the judiciary's own constitutional morality. But he gives the community little say regarding the implications of its own constitutional morality. He makes several arguments for casting judges, rather than legislators, as the moral expositors. Judges, he asserts, are better positioned than legislators to enforce the community's constitutional morality because they are "objective," "impartial," and "neutral," rather than subject to "biases" and "allegiances," as legislators are. (235-36)[6] I suppose we could appoint all legislators to life terms, as well, rather than having them answer to constituents, with their bothersome "biases and allegiances." Waluchow surely does not support such an oligarchic proposal, but he might have explained why impartiality trumps accountability for judges deciding Charter cases, but not for ordinary legislators.


Another argument that Waluchow makes, oddly, is that legislators cannot foresee all of the ways in which legislation might infringe Charter values. (235) This argument seems to me irrelevant to the very cases that interest Waluchow. Consider the (2008) decision of the Supreme Court of Connecticut that legalized same-sex marriage under the state constitution. One cannot defend this decision by claiming that the Connecticut General Assembly was unable to "foresee" the issue. The Assembly had already granted legal recognition to same-sex unions, but deliberately withheld the title of "marriage" from these unions. The representatives are not, in fact, too busy or uninformed to legalize same-sex marriage. They, and their constituents, have simply chosen not to do so. One might, of course, override their decision in the name of ideal morality, but Waluchow rejects this understanding of judicial review. He insists that overturning legislation is legitimate only if the people have misunderstood the implications of their own basic moral commitments.

Waluchow also emphasizes the "symbolic" value of Charters in responding to Waldron's contention that public debate on basic moral issues could be more candid and vigorous in the absence of an entrenched, written Charter. (242-44) Charters, Waluchow states, "help define and reinforce the character of the nation as one publicly committed, in its legal and moral practices, to the fundamental rights and values it includes." (244) But the symbolic value of a Charter largely depends upon the extent to which people believe that it is, in fact, the Charter that governs them. The common law method, which puts greater distance between entrenched text and constitutional jurisprudence, as practiced, would seem to weaken the symbolic value of the document over time. Indeed, many originalists see non-originalist courts in the USA as rejecting a public commitment to the Constitution. The originalists may be wrong, but where symbolism is the issue, appearances are everything. One might also suggest that there is symbolic value in seeing elected legislators, rather than unelected judges, make final constitutional decisions.

All of this makes me wonder to whom Waluchow's arguments are addressed. I do not believe that he intends to persuade originalists of the merits of the common law method. It seems to me, rather, that he aims to reassure his fellow supporters of judicially mandated same-sex marriage that they are really just enforcing the constitutional values to which everyone is already committed. If he is correct, then supporters of same-sex marriage who use the courts to advance their agenda, against considerable opposition from the electorate, need not worry that they are thereby compromising democratic values, even to the slightest degree. Myself a strong supporter of same-sex marriage, I would like to believe that I can have it both ways, but I am not persuaded. Waluchow asserts that he does not wish to be "labeled an elitist and paternalist" (91), but if the labels stick (to us both) then perhaps we should accept them.


Finally, one might worry that Waluchow's arguments focus upon a misleadingly narrow class of cases that make judicial review look irresistible to politically progressive readers. A reader whose only knowledge of the subject comes from Waluchow could close the book with the impression that judicial review always involves overturning retrograde legislation that oppresses social minorities. One wonders what Waluchow thinks about courts overturning legislation that is new, popular with political progressives, and designed to protect the interests of historically oppressed groups. Some recent decisions of the U.S. Supreme Court fit this profile. The Court has overturned handgun ownership laws in the District of Columbia (2008), the Gun Free School Zones Act (1995), and the Violence Against Women Act (2000). It has invalidated an affirmative action plan for undergraduate admissions (2003). It has blocked the application of a New Jersey civil rights law to the Boy Scouts of America, thereby permitting the Scouts to exclude gay males (2000). It has invalidated a municipal ordinance banning inflammatory racist speech (1992). Waluchow could argue that the Court did not properly apply the common law method in these cases, but he never argues that using his method makes such results harder to reach. That, in itself, is not a flaw in his theory, but it does mean that he is not entitled to get much credit for associating his method with such admirable causes as desegregation and same-sex marriage.


Writing a monograph about the theory of judicial review is, by now, an act of courage. Hundreds of books and thousands of lengthy law review articles have been written on the topic. It is difficult to say anything new, and the author bears a burden to explain how his view differs from similar ones developed in the literature. Waluchow spends little time criticizing the arguments of "conservative" originalists or contrasting himself with other "liberal" non-originalists. His critiques of originalism are competent, but they add little to those advanced by Dworkin (1996), Ely (1980), Brest (1980), Lyons (1986), and others.

The novelty of Waluchow's own living-tree theory is also hard to gauge. It would have helped if he had spent a few pages distinguishing himself from familiar non-originalists, such as Ackerman (1991), Breyer (2005), Ely (1980), Fallon (2001), Sager (2004), and Sunstein (1999). Even his discussion of Dworkin does not tell me where he stands on Dworkin's contention that judges should follow the "semantic intentions" of the Constitution's framers, rather than the framers' "expectation intentions" (what effects they expected their language to have). Dworkin holds that the Constitution itself does not change (except when amended), although our understanding of what it requires must be informed by our best current understanding of the moral concepts in the text. This position allows judicial review to track changing moral opinions to some degree while keeping a closer connection to the text than the common law method demands. No doubt Waluchow's theory has some advantages over Dworkin's, but the reader is left to conjure these for herself, aided perhaps by Waluchow's (1994) critique of Dworkin.[7]

I wonder, also, why Waluchow never engages David Strauss's well-known (1996) paper on common law constitutional interpretation. He quotes Strauss but once. The only theorist who receives extensive critical treatment is Waldron. American law professors will be disappointed to find no discussion of two other prominent liberal Critics, Mark Tushnet (1999) and Larry Kramer (2004), although Waluchow does tackle several Canadian Critics. That said, the sections on Waldron showcase Waluchow at his most convincing. In fact, the book might best be understood as a detailed response to Waldron (1999a; 1999b), defending a relatively weak, Canadian form of judicial review against Waldron's categorical opposition to all types of judicial review. As I have noted, I remain uncertain if Waluchow intends his arguments also to support strong, American-style judicial review.


Waluchow has written a book that is unusually enjoyable to read. I recommend it enthusiastically to philosophers who want to learn more about judicial review or who seek a vigorous critique of Waldron's arguments against it. There is definite value for philosophers in this book-length presentation of a living tree view, even if its novelty is not always apparent. Many American legal scholars will also find Waluchow's overall perspective congenial, but those immersed in the theoretical literature on judicial review may struggle to see precisely what Waluchow intends his contribution to be.


Ackerman, Bruce. (1991). We the People: Foundations. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press).

Brest, Paul. (1980). "The Misconceived Quest for the Original Understanding." Boston University Law Review, 60, pp. 204-38.

Breyer, Stephen. (2005). Active Liberty: Interpreting Our Democratic Constitution. (New York: Alfred A. Knopf).

Dworkin, Ronald. (1996). Freedom's Law: The Moral Reading of the American Constitution. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press).

Ely, John Hart. (1980). Democracy and Distrust. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press).

Fallon, Richard H., Jr. (2001). Implementing the Constitution. (Cambridge: Harvard University Press).

Farber, Daniel and Suzanna Sherry. (2002). Desperately Seeking Certainty: The Misguided Quest for Constitutional Foundations. (Chicago: University of Chicago Press).

Kramer, Larry D. (2004). The People Themselves: Popular Constitutionalism and Judicial Review. (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Lyons, David. (1986). "Constitutional Interpretation and Original Meaning." Social Philosophy & Policy, 4, pp. 75-101.

Sager, Lawrence. (2004). Justice in Plainclothes: A Theory of American Constitutional Practice. (New Haven: Yale University Press).

Schauer, Frederick. "Is the Common Law Law?" California Law Review, 77, pp. 455-71.

Stoner, James, Jr. (2003). Common-Law Liberty: Rethinking American Constitutionalism. (Lawrence: University Press of Kansas).

Strauss, David A. (1996). "Common Law Constitutional Interpretation." University of Chicago Law Review, 63, pp. 877-935.

---. (forthcoming). The Common Law Constitution.

Sunstein, Cass R. (1999). One Case at a Time: Judicial Minimalism on the Supreme Court. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press).

Tushnet, Mark. (1999). Taking the Constitution Away from the Courts. (Princeton: Princeton University Press).

Waldron, Jeremy. (1999a). Law and Disagreement. (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

---. (1999b). The Dignity of Legislation. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).

Waluchow, W.J. (1994). Inclusive Legal Positivism. (Oxford: Clarendon Press).

Court Cases

Bowers v. Hardwick. (1986). 478 U.S. 186.

Boy Scouts of America v. Dale. (2000). 530 U.S. 640.

Brown v. Board of Education. (1954). 347 U.S. 483.

Furman v. Georgia. (1972). 408 U.S. 238.

Gratz v. Bollinger. (2003). 539 U.S. 244.

Heller, District of Columbia v. (2008). 128 S. Ct. 2783.

Kerrigan and Mock v. Connecticut Department of Public Health. (2008). (SC 17716).

Lopez, U.S. v. (1995). 514 U.S. 549.

Mapp v. Ohio. (1961). 367 U.S. 643.

Morrison, U.S. v. (2000). 529 U.S. 598.

R.A.V. v. St. Paul. (1992). 505 U.S. 377.

Roe v. Wade. (1973). 410 U.S. 113.

[1] Page references in the text refer to the book under review, unless otherwise noted.

[2] All courts have the power to modify common law rules so that the rule, as modified, would still support the results reached in previous cases. Higher courts have the additional power to modify common law rules even to the extent that they conflict with results reached in prior cases.

[3] I am ignoring the fact that the text of the First Amendment refers only to Congress, as the Amendment was later applied to the several states via incorporation into the Fourteenth Amendment.

[4] See bibliography of cases, below.

[5] Actually, the Canadian Parliament legalized same-sex marriage with the Civil Marriage Act of 2005, but the whole point of Waluchow's position is that the courts should have legalized it earlier.

[6] Waluchow does not note, in this connection, that most state judges in the USA are elected and lack life tenure. A state judge engages in judicial review under her state constitution.

[7] Waluchow classifies Dworkin's as a kindred, "living tree" view (68-70) but also indicates that he rejects some aspects of Dworkin's theory (227).