A Companion to Ricoeur's Fallible Man

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Scott Davidson (ed.), A Companion to Ricoeur's Fallible Man, Lexington, 2019, 211pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498587112.

Reviewed by John Arthos, Indiana University Bloomington


Paul Ricoeur's Fallible Man is a book well served by a scholarly companion. In addition to its inherent value as a prodigious work of philosophical reflection, Fallible Man plays a pivotal role in the arc of his journey as a philosopher. Yet it is a work of confounding obscurities. It is a difficult book for several reasons. Even though Ricoeur is at pains to say what his purpose is and how he will proceed, the texture of his argument is caught up in a swirl of sublimated voices and issues that remain opaque to the untutored reader. His early writings are even more multi-voiced than his later works, dense with the myriad streams of intellectual influence at that particularly generative time and place in French intellectual culture. It is also a work of transition in Ricoeur's effort to find a philosophical method. In this early period, Ricoeur wrestled with questions of approach and perspective, and the first books bear the signs of that struggle. Fallible Man comes in the middle of a three-part sequence whose direction is radically revised over the course of ten years, before the project is finally aborted. Of the books in the series, Fallible Man seems to bear the strain of this restless journey the most. Finally, Fallible Man sits at a nexus of tension within Ricoeur's own mind between the demands of religion and philosophy. "Fallibility" in the title is a richly overdetermined term, more resonant with echoes of Pascal, Paul, and Kierkegaard in its religiously-tinged themes of fallenness, guilt, innocence, evil, and sin than its closest cognates in secular philosophy. As a result, the book is a palimpsest that needs careful deciphering.

The book, edited by Scott Davidson with contributions from a host of prominent Ricoeur scholars, goes a long way toward filling the need for guidance in tackling this challenging work. The anthology is of the highest scholarly caliber, with incisive, probing, and useful contributions. It is a testament to its larger unity that each of the chapters offers something unique, but generally works in harmony with the rest. My summary of the individual contributions should be understood as only a minimal indication of these substantial and rigorous studies.

In the opening chapter, Daniel Frey examines the intellectual ferment which Ricoeur himself described as the "revolution at the very center of my self," and that we now know as his hermeneutic turn (3). Frey shows how this turn was propelled by the tension in Ricoeur's location between philosophy and religion. Thus the philosophical relation of finitude to infinity -- which for Gadamer becomes simply a meditation on the temporal and historical structure of social understanding -- draws Ricoeur into questions of innocence, guilt, fault, forgiveness, and transcendence. Frey tracks Ricoeur's suspension of his phenomenological project when Ricoeur discovers that he cannot continue along the arc of description as a post-war French philosopher tackling the problem of evil in all its depth. It is only by the indirection of myth, symbol and figure that he will be able to peer into its profundities. Frey's thesis is that the Adamic myth is not just a privileged example for Ricoeur's slowly emerging theory of narrative identity, but the orienting mythology for interrogating his moral quandaries about the human condition.

Jérôme Porée seeks to understand the tension between Karl Jaspers' seminal influence on Ricoeur and Ricoeur's eventual distancing from him. Porée's thesis is that, despite Ricoeur's turn from Jaspers' philosophy of existence to Gabriel Marcel's mystery of being, Ricoeur remained faithful to Jasper in fundamental ways. In line with Frey's chapter, this exploration of contending influences throws light on Ricoeur's own internal struggle between the competing claims of philosophy and religion. The question of worldly transcendence for Jaspers, Marcel, and Ricoeur acts as the through-line of the analysis, and is the key to Ricoeur's movement toward Marcel. If Jaspers' notion of transcendence does not reduce to Heidegger's philosophy of finitude, neither does it escape the debilitating paradoxes of frail human existence. Jaspers' inability to reconcile the ciphers of transcendence with human finitude is, in the end, what separates him from Ricoeur, who always maintained hope in the face of human fragility.

Luz Ascárate sees Fallible Man as a broadening of Ricoeur's methodological palette to make use of the Kantian transcendental imagination while retaining the phenomenological viewpoint. Ascárate argues that Ricoeur does this by shifting the synthetic operation of Kant from consciousness to "thing." This gives us, in Ascárate's view, a new conception of objectivity, a phenomenality that is itself imbued with its own conditions of possibility. The freedom that imagination gives to the will empowers the passage from the condition of fallibility to the possibility of fault, a passage that, in the Adamic narrative, unfolds in the space between the antediluvian and post-apocalyptic kingdom of innocence.

Brian Gregor provides an account of the counter-pull that Marcel exerted on Fallible Man against the influence of Descartes, Kant, Husserl, Jaspers, and Heidegger. Marcel's reflective philosophy is integral to the structure of Fallible Man -- in the mystery of transcendence, the priority of existence over act, primary and secondary reflection, thinking as recollection, and most importantly, Marcel's grounding belief in a being prior to the participation of humanity. Yet Gregor hypothesizes that Ricoeur faulted Marcel for granting too much power to reflection over reality, or, as Ricoeur would put it, for returning too quickly to being. Thus Kant's critical realism, Hegel's historicism, and Husserl's phenomenology give Ricoeur the conceptual means to slow this return by making reflection more responsible to empirical objectivity.

Davidson's chapter on the influence of Jean Nabert feels indispensable in guiding us to the logical structure of Fallible Man, showing how Nabert's "reflective method" serves as a precursor and model to Ricoeur's early anthropology. Davidson draws a parallel between the driving force of the reflective method with the motive force of the self's journey of self-realization, so that the logic of the philosophical inquiry mirrors the logic of its object of investigation. Davidson argues that, insofar as Ricoeur adopts Nabert's positioning of reflexive philosophy as a via media between Kant's critical distancing of reason and Maine de Biran's "intimacy of conscious life," reflexive philosophy acts as a kind of hermeneutic key to the argument structure of Fallible Man (66).

Geoffrey Dierckxsens' discovery of congruences between early Ricoeur and the new interdisciplinary concept of "enactivism," a theory of emergent cognitive-environmental reciprocity, takes a step away from the Companion's history of influence, but it does draw thematic connections across the seventy years between the 1950s and now, reminding us that Fallible Man can still speak to us a living text. This linkage recalls how much French phenomenology of the period of Fallible Man was feeling its way toward the anti-dualist insights that enactivism is now bringing to a broader interdisciplinary landscape.

Annemie Halsema's contribution does important integrating work in the anthology, connecting Ricoeur's early and middle periods, correcting a reductive reading of his concept of narrative identity as an exclusively discursive construct, and showing Ricoeur's relevance to our current interest in pre-linguistic, affective understanding. Halsema draws Ricoeur's phenomenological roots into his theory of the narrative self by, in effect, mapping the material anthropology of Fallible Man onto the discursive identity of Oneself as Another. This mapping gives us a Ricoeur who fully appreciates the involvement -- indeed the entanglement -- of a narrative self embedded in a material world of objects, bodies, affects, and others. Hermeneutic agency thus gains its proper register. It is "not because of language that we become aware of the perspective nature that embodiment confines us to, but that language supports transcending our own perspective" (135).

Pol Vandevelde is especially impressed by the radicality of Ricoeur's later development of a narrative perspective, which required Ricoeur to abandon the psychologism Vandevelde believes is present in Fallible Man. In the later narrative perspective, the synthesis of the self is a work that is accomplished by the reflective process of telling. What Ricoeur accomplished in this transition, Vandevelde argues, was to transform the structures of the involuntary, disproportion, and passivity from ontological into ethical categories. Vandevelde's thesis is the strongest case in the anthology for a developmental view of Ricoeur's intellectual career from early to late, and along with Halsema's contribution, brings us forward into the theoretical riches of the middle and late work.

By contrast, Timo Helenius opposes a developmental account of Ricoeur's philosophy that moves from a focus on fallibility in the early work, to capability in the later work. Helenius proposes a strictly binary dialectic in which fallibility and capability actuate each other, like an alternating current in which the non-coincidence of the self to itself creates a perpetual fluctuation. This oscillation echoes the Christian narrative of "a certain losing of the self in order for it to be regained," a passion play of exile and reconciliation that is reenacted throughout Ricoeur's intellectual career. To support this reading, Helenius first interprets Freedom and Nature and Fallible Man as thematically reciprocal rather than theoretically developmental, and then argues these works and the late works on recognition and forgiveness show the same reciprocal interanimation.

This Companion is a rich and substantive guide to an early and pivotal work in Ricoeur's career, rendering visible its unvoiced conversations with Ricoeur's philosophical contemporaries, demonstrating its significant debt to the biblical imagination of Christian mythology, and situating it in the complex weave of Ricoeur's intellectual journey early and late. It should be clear by now that I am recommending it as something close to required reading for anyone who wishes to come to terms with one of Ricoeur's more elusive works. Because its individual chapters each contribute to important aspects of its subject, both in Fallible Man's internal argument and its relation to the larger oeuvre, the collection offers a pleasant exception to academic anthologies that serve as loosely related occasional works around a theme. It will sit on my bookshelf as a durable reference for a key text.