A Confusion of the Spheres: Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein on Philosophy and Religion

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Ginia Schönbaumsfeld, A Confusion of the Spheres: Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein on Philosophy and Religion, Oxford University Press, 2007, 213pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199229826.

Reviewed by Wayne Proudfoot, Columbia University


Wittgenstein told his friend Maurice Drury that Kierkegaard was the most profound author of the nineteenth century and a saint. His writing on philosophy and religion has sometimes been compared with that of Kierkegaard, particularly in the pseudonymous works. Schönbaumsfeld reviews the evidence for Kierkegaard's influence on Wittgenstein, points to strong similarities between them on the aims of philosophy and on their conceptions of religious belief, and criticizes interpreters whom she takes to have distorted their views on these topics. She argues that for both authors spiritual cultivation is more important for religious understanding than intellectual analysis of a set of doctrines. By examining their views Schönbaumsfeld hopes to contribute toward a conception of religion as something other than adherence to metaphysical beliefs or a non-cognitive attitude immune from rational criticism and support, but this alternative conception is not well developed in the book.

Much of the evidence Schönbaumsfeld presents for Kierkegaard's influence on Wittgenstein is familiar, but she includes quotations from recently published diaries and other material that was not available to scholars who have previously addressed this issue. At his request, Wittgenstein's sister sent him several of Kierkegaard's volumes while he was at the front in 1917. Wittgenstein's students testify to the fact that he held Kierkegaard in high esteem and he reflects on Kierkegaard and his works at a number of points throughout the journals and the notebooks. Schönbaumsfeld surveys all of the relevant references. She occasionally reaches too far when she suggests that Wittgenstein's uses of the terms "paradox" and "absurd" are Kierkegaardian and are evidence for direct influence even when those uses seem to differ from Kierkegaard's use of those terms (24, 33). Her overall point, though, about similarity and some influence is well taken.

Both Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein regard philosophy as an ethical pursuit in which analysis and conceptual clarification are to be employed not in the service of speculative thought, but to identify self-deception and dispel illusion in order to make it possible to live an authentic life. Reflection and intellect are insufficient to overcome these illusions without appropriation and will. Each author writes in such a way as to do something to the reader and to elicit a kind of self-transformation. Both understand that this requires indirect communication, though they differ greatly in the styles they adopt. Kierkegaard reflects at length on his use of pseudonyms and on the need for indirect communication in order to elicit a response. He provokes, seduces, and confronts his readers. Wittgenstein also comments on the appropriate style for philosophy, remarking that it ought to be written as a poetic composition, but his style is quite different from Kierkegaard's. In a very interesting diary entry from 1931 he writes: "Kierkegaard's writings are teasing and this is of course their intention, although I am not sure whether the exact effect they produce in me is intentional" (27). While he recognizes that this manipulation of the reader could be put to good use, he finds it morally questionable. He resents the idea that someone might trick him into doing something he doesn't want to do. Even if he had the courage to adopt this trick himself, he says, he doubts whether he would have the right to employ it, and he thinks it shows a lack of love for one's neighbor.

D. Z. Phillips argues that Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein are engaged in completely different projects that can't be compared. Wittgenstein, he writes, operates with a contemplative view of philosophy that is independent of other commitments and Kierkegaard is a religious thinker who uses philosophy only instrumentally. Schönbaumsfeld rightly rejects this thesis along with its sharp distinction between philosophy and religion, a distinction that neither Kierkegaard nor Wittgenstein would accept. They each hold a broadly ethical conception of the aims of philosophy and they view Christianity not as a set of metaphysical beliefs, but as an existence-communication to be appropriated and put into practice. Philosophical analysis helps to clarify concepts, to expose self-deception, and to remove illusions that interfere with this appropriation. Schönbaumsfeld identifies Kierkegaard's stages or spheres of existence with Wittgenstein's forms of life, citing Stanley Cavell as the first to draw attention to the parallel between them.

Schönbaumsfeld structures her exposition throughout in response to interpretations of Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein that she considers misguided. Her fullest response is to James Conant's resolute reading of Wittgenstein's Tractatus and his comparison of that work with Kierkegaard's Concluding Unscientific Postscript. This chapter is almost twice as long as any other in the book and it is here that she seems most engaged. Conant and Schönbaumsfeld agree that Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein view philosophical analysis as clarification in the service of an authentic life, but Conant reads both books as ironic, self-refuting works intended to undermine any attempt either to do metaphysics or to express something that eludes language.

The Tractatus and the Postscript each conclude with a revocation. Wittgenstein writes that anyone who understands him will recognize his propositions as nonsensical and will use them as steps to climb beyond them, after which he will throw them away. Kierkegaard's pseudonym, Johannes Climacus, says that everything in the Postscript is to be understood in such a way that it is revoked, adding that to write a book and revoke it is not the same as not writing it. According to Conant, Climacus and Wittgenstein constructed these elaborate works that seem to be meaningful in order to show how prone we are to the illusion of meaning where there is none. Climacus, in Conant's view, exposes the folly of thinking that philosophy can clarify what it is to be a Christian and Wittgenstein shows the emptiness of thinking that there might be something ineffable that transcends logic and language.

Wittgenstein writes in the Tractatus that philosophy can signify what cannot be said by stating clearly what can be said and he also writes that what cannot be put into words makes itself manifest. Conant takes that language, along with the rest of the body of the book, to be simple nonsense that is revoked in the framing material, which consists chiefly of the preface and the last three propositions. Schönbaumsfeld raises two objections to this reading. First, it requires us to dismiss not only statements in the Tractatus about the inexpressible, but similar comments that Wittgenstein makes in early notebooks and in the 1929 "Lecture on ethics." Conant reads the Tractatus through the lens of the Philosophical Investigations, but Wittgenstein does seem to hold in his early period that ethical and religious statements are attempts to signify what cannot be put into words and that they should be respected as such. Second, Conant claims that the framing material is to be taken at face value and that the rest of the book is nonsense, but he gives no clear criteria for identifying the frame. He relies on a few passages not included in the preface and conclusion, but doesn't say how these are to be picked out. He also considers sentences in the body of the work that he argues are meaningless, but Schönbaumsfeld says that even this reading would be impossible if they were gibberish as he suggests.

For Conant, the guiding assumption of the Postscript, as of the Tractatus, is that philosophers are tempted to project meaning onto pseudo-propositions that lack any clear sense. He takes Climacus's long and complex discussions of inwardness, suffering, guilt, paradox, and other topics to be nonsense. The book's frame consists chiefly in its two appendices, "A glance at a contemporary effort in Danish literature," in which Climacus reviews the works of Kierkegaard's other pseudonyms, and "An understanding with the reader," in which he revokes everything and writes that anyone who appeals to the authority of the book has misunderstood it. Here, as in the Tractatus, Conant's sharp distinction between frame and nonsense requires criteria that he doesn't supply. The appendices contain concepts and statements that seem continuous with claims in the body of the work and Conant appeals directly to passages not in the appendices. Schönbaumsfeld argues that Climacus's target is not philosophy in general, but Hegelian speculative philosophy, and that he revokes the work to keep it from being confused with that particular program. Climacus's analyses in the Postscript of such concepts as subjectivity, inwardness, suffering, guilt, and dialectical contradiction are not nonsense, though he makes clear that clarification of what it is to be a Christian will not make one a Christian.

The final chapter is devoted to the question of how religion is to be understood. Schönbaumsfeld counters the criticism by Kai Nielsen and others that Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein are fideists, reducing religion to a non-cognitive attitude that is distinct from belief or doctrine. For both, she writes, Christianity is and is not a doctrine. The grammar of "God" is not that of an entity and it doesn't make sense to ask whether God exists. If one is not already a believer, no argument or evidence will settle or even address this issue. In his Lectures and Conversations Wittgenstein notes that religious language sometimes makes use of a picture as in the idea that God sees all, and that the meaning of this idea or of a doctrine like the Last Judgment cannot be separated from such pictures. The idea and the doctrine can't be understood apart from the linguistic and social practices that give them their meaning.

Schönbaumsfeld distinguishes between an internal component of understanding that is accessible only from within a particular form of life and its practices and an external component that is independently available. Musical understanding, for instance, requires training in order to discern what would otherwise be inaccessible. Similarly, she writes, spiritual cultivation and development are required for a proper understanding of religious expressions. This point is central to the book, as signaled by her invocation of Marguerite Porète on the first and last pages, but Schönbaumsfeld doesn't develop it. She calls for a combination of internal and external approaches, but doesn't clarify either of them or how they relate to one another. Both are required for full understanding in any domain, she says, but religious and aesthetic language resist paraphrase in a way that ordinary language usually does not. She says that it is ironic that the need for attention to context and practice is recognized in most areas of philosophy, but not in philosophy of religion. She cites examples of statements that resist paraphrase, like "Juliet is the sun" or Cora Diamond's suggestion that the concept of beauty is transformed when we call George Eliot beautiful. But more explication is required as to just how these examples shed light on religious uses of language and on the social practices that govern those uses.

The issue of criteria for understanding concepts and practices internal to a particular sphere might be illuminated by attending to some of the differences between Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein. Schönbaumsfeld has concentrated on the similarities between them. She has approached these similarities chiefly through questions raised by critics who work on Wittgenstein (e.g., Phillips, Conant, Nielsen), though she herself seems well acquainted with Kierkegaard's work. She identifies Kierkegaard's stages or spheres of existence with Wittgenstein's forms of life, but Kierkegaard's depiction of the stages is centered on questions of agency and freedom while Wittgenstein introduces the concept of a form of life to clarify what it is to speak, and thus to understand, a language. Clarification of these different interests might shed some light on the questions of how spheres are to be identified when considering religious beliefs and practices and what kind of cultivation is necessary for internal understanding of those beliefs and practices. That would enable Schönbaumsfeld to better articulate the contribution to contemporary philosophical reflection on religion that she thinks can be gained from reflection on these similarities between Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein.