A Covenant of Creatures: Levinas's Philosophy of Judaism

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Michael Fagenblat, A Covenant of Creatures: Levinas's Philosophy of Judaism, Stanford University Press, 2010, 281pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780804768702.

Reviewed by Kenneth Seeskin, Northwestern University


In the Preface to this rich and thought-provoking study, Fagenblat raises a good question: "Another book on Emmanuel Levinas?" But it does not take long for the reader to see that this volume is definitely needed. According to Fagenblat, Levinas's fundamental project was to develop a post-Heideggarian account of ethics, which means an account that retains the binding nature of our most basic ethical intuitions. In Fagenblat's words:

Levinas sought to restore a new sense of an unconditional ethical imperative that could not be dismissed as merely abstract, formal, ahistorical, inauthentic, and ontologically inadequate. He did this by developing a phenomenology of the moral imperative that was derived not from the fact of Reason but from the face of the Other. (p. xix)

Against Heidegger and much of twentieth-century philosophy, Levinas was firmly convinced, as Fagenblat puts it (p. 14), that ethical judgment is exercised over history and not simply within history.

The problem is that for Levinas, the face of the Other is completely transcendent and thus cannot be captured by description, explanation, or narration. As Fagenblat rightly observes (p. xx), it can only be respected or desired, loved or hated. That is why Levinas thinks ethics is first philosophy: it is the source of all meaning and intelligibility and cannot be derived from anything more basic. I will postpone the question of what type of ethics this approach produces until later. For the present, the important point is that, according to Fagenblat, Levinas reaches this conclusion not by conducting an exercise in pure phenomenology but by drawing on sources from Jewish tradition. What results is in fact "a coherent philosophy of Judaism" (p. xxii).

It will surprise no one to hear that Levinas was a committed Jew. We can appreciate the novelty of Fagenblat's comment if we recognize that Levinas insisted that his philosophy was independent of all confessions of faith or religious affiliations. Those familiar with the literature on Levinas will see at once that his description of his work led to a conundrum reminiscent of the Athens vs. Jerusalem controversy popularized by Leo Strauss. As Fagenblat sees it, critics like Badiou, Butler, Janicaud, and Rose accuse him of sneaking in religious considerations by privileging "pious and dogmatic" assertions of a non-rational Law that is immune from philosophic critique. Alternatively, Gibbs and Batnitzky accuse him of abandoning revelation by privileging Plato's "Good beyond Being" or Kant's Primacy of Practical Reason. For those in the first group, Levinas has no real philosophy; for those in the second, no real Judaism.

Fagenblat argues that both groups miss the point. "It is not a matter of collapsing Judaism . . . into philosophical discourse but of insisting on the constitutive and permanent possibility for radical interpretation of one by the other." (p. 13) Rather than accepting a sharp dichotomy between philosophy and Judaism or Athens and Jerusalem, Fagenblat's Levinas provides "a philosophy of Judaism without and or between." (p. 14) The result is a deep and nuanced discussion of Levinas, one that deliberately goes beyond what Fageneblat terms "the identity politics of 'being Jewish'" but still attempts to read him against the background of biblical sources and the classics of Jewish philosophy, in particular Maimonides. For Maimonides too, the question "Is it Judaism or philosophy?" fails to do justice to the depth and subtlety of his thought. This gives us a good answer to the question of why we need another book on Levinas: because Fagenblat's Levinas is not the one most of us are used to reading.

More specifically, Fagenblat sees a "seismic shift" between the Levinas of Totality and Infinity -- Levinas 1 -- and the Levinas of Otherwise than Being -- Levinas 2. Whereas Levinas 1 is content to give a broadly metaphysical account of agency and transcendence that Fagenblat discusses in connection with the problem of creation, Levinas 2 offers a post-metaphysical vision, which turns out to be nothing short of a "Judaic ethical negative theology."

Spatial limitations prevent me from saying as much about Levinas 1 as I would like and as Fagenblat's exposition deserves. Beyond that, my own interest in Maimonides makes me a receptive audience for Levinas 2. Not surprisingly, Levinas's reading of Maimonides parallels that of Hermann Cohen. The highest human achievement is the apprehension of God. But as God tells Moses in Exodus 33, no mortal can see the face of God and live. Maimonides took this to mean that no mortal can know the essence of God. According to Cohen, if there is no essence, there is no basis for metaphysics. Those familiar with the passage will recall that while Moses cannot see God's face, God does allow him to see his back side, later identified as "all of my goodness." What Moses got then was not insight into the nature of God's existence but recognition of God's status as an exemplar of kindness, sound judgment, and fairness. Instead of a list of attributes that identify God as a unique being at the top of an ascending hierarchy of beings, we have guidance on how to behave toward other people. Instead of a life of pure contemplation, a life of praxis.

As Maimonides develops this idea, all attempts to describe or classify God fail. Though negative predicates like "does not lack intelligence" or "does not lack power" are better than positive ones like "is intelligent" or "is powerful," even the former fail to the degree that they introduce some measure of particularity to that which cannot be particularized. This is not the place to question the accuracy of Cohen's and Levinas's reading of Maimonides. Suffice it to say that if they are right, Maimonides too replaced metaphysics with ethics. To apprehend God is not to achieve mastery over a system of interrelated concepts but to treat one's neighbor with the respect that is owed her. In the words of Jean-Luc Marion (cited by Fagenblat on p. 127): theology "is no longer a matter of naming or attributing something to something but rather of aiming in the direction of . . ., of relating to . . ., of composing oneself towards . . ., of reckoning with . . . -- in short, of dealing with . . ."

Needless to say, Levinas is not as overtly theological as Maimonides. Rather than a negative theology of God, we have what one might call a negative theology of the Other. Like God in negative theology, the Other overwhelms thought, resists classification, and cannot be identified by a system of interrelated concepts. As Fabgenblat sees it, transcendence for Levinas is not something the intellect can grasp by means of properties or predicates; it is never positive and has no identifiable essence. Like God in Exodus 33, the Other does not show himself directly but only by his trace. Again from Fagenblat (p.117), transcendence is not a concept but what Levinas calls a sens, by which is meant an orientation rather than an apprehension.

The most authentic response to transcendence is humility, which merits a whole subsection in Fagenblat's Chapter 4. "Ethical negative theology," he writes, "is a spiritual exercise that negates knowledge so as to acknowledge the Other." (p. 118) It acquaints us with the finitude and partiality of anything that can be grasped by means of concepts. As Fagenblat observes, humility is a primary instance of Maimonides’ departure from Aristotle. Humility, or what Maimonides terms "lowliness of spirit," is thus the negative theological virtue par excellence. In Levinasian terms, it bids us to question our concepts, our social station, our very sense of ourselves as a self. To repeat: Levinas is not as overtly theological as Maimonides. But the similarities are striking. Again from Fagenblat: "Humility is no longer a matter of opening oneself to the other but of acknowledging that there is no real self except by way of the other, an other who is essentially unknowable." (p. 122)

Let us now return to the question mentioned above: what kind of ethics does this approach give us? Classic thinkers like Aristotle, Kant, and Mill produced well-articulated theories with discussions of method, analysis of concepts, and elaborate accounts of the virtues. But these thinkers were not motivated by negative theology. For Aristotle, God is the primary object of knowledge, the subject of first philosophy. For Kant, God is a necessary postulate of moral reason. For Mill, there is no God. If Fagenblat is right, we should not expect Levinas's ethics to be anything like theirs, and indeed it is not. So let us ask our question again: what kind of ethics is this that defies explanation and description? Put otherwise, if the Other is as unknowable as Levinas insists, can there be an ethics at all? The ultimate outcome of Maimonides's negative theology is a Jobian-like silence in the presence of God. Is this all Levinas wants for the Other?

This question takes us to the crux of Fagenblat's interpretation. Each of us is to take full responsibility for the Other. If need be, each of us is to give his life for the Other. The prohibition against murder of the Other is sacrosanct. Yet important as these insights might be, they still do not give us an ethics in the full sense of the word. As Fagenblat asks, "Without a more or less determined historical horizon of others, can ethics be anything more than subjective individualism and abstract humanism?" (p. 180) The question is particularly telling because subjective individualism and abstract humanism are exactly what Levinas set out to avoid. Again we face a Scylla and Charybdis situation. To the traditional theologian, Levinas has replaced God with the Other. To the traditional ethical theorist, he has replaced a constructive account of our moral intuitions with the dogmatism of the face.

Fagenblat responds by saying that for Levinas there are no formal ethical concepts and no pure ethical intuitions. Instead what we have is an account of the historical conditioning of our concepts and the hermeneutical character of our intuitions; in short, "a descriptive [i.e. phenomenological] argument about who we are" (p. 196). It is from this that Fagenblat derives a "covenant of creatures," where, in effect, we are all our brothers' keepers. No doubt some will conclude that Levinas has dropped the ball, while others will see an attempt to re-appropriate the transcendence of ethical obligation in a secular and post-modern age. Fagenblat is to be commended for putting these issues before us in sharp and historically informed relief.

Whichever side one takes in this dispute, one thing is certain: even though Levinas draws on Jewish sources, one does not have to make a confession of faith or reveal one's religious affiliation, if any, to appreciate his contribution to philosophy. As for Fagenblat, by any relevant criterion -- depth, clarity, originality, or scholarly integrity -- this book is first rate.