A Hunger for Aesthetics: Enacting the Demands of Art

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Michael Kelly, A Hunger for Aesthetics: Enacting the Demands of Art, Columbia University Press, 2012, 242pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231152921.

Reviewed by Crispin Sartwell, Dickinson College


One symptom of the wooliness of Michael Kelly's A Hunger for Aesthetics is its equivocation on the word 'aesthetics.' Kelly's project is a defense against the 'anti-aesthetic stance' that he asserts has characterized the art world since the 1960s. But the reader is left uncertain what such a stance is, and hence about what Kelly's defense might signify. He uses 'aesthetic' to mean at least (1) pertaining to art, (2) pertaining to the sensuous and affective aspects of experience, (3) pertaining to pictorial representations, images, or icons, (4) pertaining to the philosophical discipline of aesthetics, (5) pertaining to norms or standards for the evaluation or critique of artworks or other images. Hence the 'anti-aesthetic stance' against which he inveighs might embody a rejection of any of these things.

A typically bewildering application is a passage on the painter Gerhard Richter:

He is exemplary here because, though he acknowledges the hostility toward art within the contemporary art world, his work cannot be understood adequately if seen through the eyes of the anti-aesthetic stance. He provides another set of eyes through his writings, in which, among other things, he explicitly resists anti-aesthetic interpretations of his work, even though he may seem at times to endorse them. (86)

One might hope for clarification in the discussion that follows (and be taken aback by "them there eyes"); but despite some insights along the way into Richter's series of paintings on the Baader-Meinhof gang, one only grows more bewildered about the basic conceptual structure.

At times A Hunger for Aesthetics appears to be a plea for philosophers to engage with contemporary art, or vice versa. At times it appears to be a defense of art against people who think it is politically trivial or irrelevant. At times it appears to be a defense of images against a supposedly iconoclastic culture, or art world, or theoretical atmosphere. At times it appears to be a defense of the philosophy of art as constitutive of art itself.

Any of these might be a worthy -- if relatively uncontroversial -- project, but it is often completely unclear, in any given moment or with regard to any particular work or thinker, which of them is being prosecuted. Kelly's book is strongest when it engages with particular works -- such as those of Gerhard Richter or (especially) Doris Salcedo -- without regard to Kelly's overall project or set of categories, whatever exactly these may be. What is weakest is the conceptual structure itself and the taxonomies in which it is embodied, which never emerge into any sort of focus, or even really provide much in the way of themes on which to improvise.

Another symptom of the besetting problems is the division of chapters and concepts into 'Effects.' The Dewey Effect is a "combination of moral and political demands involving apprehension, recognition, and satisfaction." The Pop Effect is "a test determining whether aestheticians [are] capable of critiquing contemporary art in its historical and philosophical variety, complexity, and temporality." The Sontag Effect reveals "how Sontag ultimately undermines the very anti-aesthetic stance she once helped to perpetuate." The Richter Effect is "the regeneration of aesthetics." The Salcedo Effect is the inquiry about whether artworks that enact suffering are morally and politically effective. This collection appears random, not really even a list of the same sorts of things. Yet it is the organizing principle of the book.

Each Effect is internally puzzling as well. Sometimes, for example, the Pop Effect seems to be an aesthetic achievement; indeed Kelly begins by agreeing with Sontag and Arthur Danto that art since Pop has been soaked in aesthetics (which seems here to mean the theory and philosophy of art). On other occasions Pop is precisely an anti-aesthetic stance or argument, or the very model of the anti-aesthetic. No clear concept or result with regard to an audience is associated with either of these. And no sooner is Kelly calling Pop anti-aesthetic than he is describing it as 'this new aesthetic.' With regard to Pop, Kelly writes:

The engagement with the contemporaneity of art leads to the contemporaneity of aesthetics. . . . Sometimes the encounter between the contemporaneity of aesthetics and that of art results in an eventual retrenchment by philosophy. For example, Cavell and Danto think that contemporary art blurs the boundary between art and philosophy. If Cavell responds by characterizing the crossed boundaries so that they are permanently eviscerated, Danto wants to reestablish the boundaries in such a way as to indemnify them against future crossing. . . To indemnify aesthetics against its own contemporaneity is to constrain the ability of aesthetics to grasp -- and learn from -- the contemporaneity of art. (49)

This is itself a description of the 'Pop Effect': the sheer fact that Pop art did have some philosophical commentators, and an appeal to aestheticians to write about contemporary art. Kelly's formulation, however, seems unnecessarily mannered.

Now perhaps some of the apparent contradictions are intentional, and Kelly argues by the end of the book that even artists such as Robert Morris who have tried to eliminate aesthetics from their work ended up expressing themselves aesthetically nevertheless. That much seems interesting, and could have been developed with more vigor if the basic terms in which the debates and descriptions are couched were clarified or used consistently. But the fact that Sontag or Morris gravitated more to aesthetics as they grew older appears, without more argument than Kelly gives, to be merely accidental: perhaps people typically grow less radical in their later years. Or perhaps the development is emblematic of a turn of the culture towards aesthetics, which would take some showing.

Perhaps the clearest way that Kelly frames his theme concerns Sontag's qualification or reversal, in Regarding the Pain of Others, of some of the central themes of her On Photography. In the latter (1977), she emphasized the function of depictions of suffering in distancing the viewer from the suffering, in making it 'aesthetic,' exploiting the victims almost to induce pleasure, or at any rate a delusory or fictional compassion. In the former (2004), she explores, for example, the effect of the Abu Ghraib photographs in crystallizing opposition to the war in Iraq. Kelly asks, as we've seen in part:

What is the rationale for Sontag's earlier view, why did she change it, and what is the relevance of her later view to the critique of the anti-aesthetic stance and, moreover, to the contemporary hunger for aesthetics? The answers to these questions, all pointing to what I call the Sontag Effect on contemporary aesthetics, reveal how Sontag ultimately undermines the very anti-aesthetic stance she once helped to perpetuate, at least on the pivotal point of moral-political art. (57)

This sheds some light on 'the anti-aesthetic stance': it is, for one thing, the stance of Sontag in On Photography. It approaches images in a way that is skeptical of their moral effects, or even turns away "iconoclastically." (On the other hand, Sontag is congratulated by Kelly for engaging with the contemporaneity of Pop art, a pro-aesthetic stance in another of his senses.) Then the 'contemporary hunger for aesthetics' is expressed in Sontag's later work.

Kelly does engage Sontag in an interesting dialogue when he gets into the details. But ultimately, his polarization into aesthetics and anti-aesthetics serves him ill. His conclusion about Sontag amounts just to: she was wrong before and then she was right; images are morally important. But all the interest of Sontag's treatment in either phase comes precisely from her ambivalence and the difficulties it makes apparent. She does not herself dismiss her own misgivings about the moral superficiality of images and the quasi-engagement they induce, but moves into the multiplicity of the effects for good and ill. Kelly sees this, I think, but his own strangely dualistic structure causes him to miss the point.

Ultimately A Hunger for Aesthetics is a defense both of the importance of the philosophy of art and of the moral seriousness of the arts, which Kelly regards as inseparable.

We should encourage and welcome the transformed truth of the concepts that should emerge from the self-critique of aesthetics because without some recalibrated versions of these or related concepts, art is unintelligible to us, and, moreover, it is ineffective when unintelligible. Art's efficacy (or effectivity) is inseparable from its intelligibility, which means its efficacy is inseparable from aesthetics, though only if aesthetics renders art intelligible through art critique. (3)

One can agree in a general way, but this passage typifies the prose and the point of this book: at once considerably too obscure and considerably too simple.