A Life-Centered Approach to Bioethics: Biocentric Ethics

Placeholder book cover

Lawrence E. Johnson, A Life-Centered Approach to Bioethics: Biocentric Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 379pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521154208.

Reviewed by Daniel P. Sulmasy, The University of Chicago


Over the last thirty years, the field of bio-ethics has been concerned predominantly with moral questions regarding the practice of human medicine and the ethics of human biomedical and behavioral research, rather than the broader biological and ecological questions implied by its name. Johnson, whose previous book, A Morally Deep World, concentrated on environmental ethics, has now made an effort to bring the insights of environmental ethics to the world of medical ethics. In doing so, he constructs a medical ethics de novo, one that he argues is more truly a bio-ethics. He does so almost without reference to the previous thirty years of scholarship in the fields of bioethics and the philosophy of medicine. The result is both refreshing and disappointing.

He begins with several chapters on general ethical theory and the methods of ethical argumentation that would be suitable for an introduction to ethics if this were serving as the main text for a professional student's only course in ethics. He presents and critiques both deontology and utilitarianism, and then presents a theory of the good that takes account of "our good as whole human beings." He discusses the imprecision of language and the difficulties this presents for making absolute moral distinctions and rules, and presents an extended discussion of slippery slope arguments.

In part II, Johnson begins to build his case for a bio-centric bioethics, beginning with contemporary evolutionary and ecological theory, explorations of the definition of life, and an inquiry into concepts such as homeostasis, health, and normality for living entities. This is a new and interesting approach to bioethics, and is instructive for the field. Most standard theories of bioethics have either been applications of general ethical theories or attempts to ground medical ethics in the practice of medicine rather than in the phenomenon of life. He offers this definition of a living entity:

A living being is an ongoing process, occurring in a dissipative thermodynamically open system, organizing and maintaining itself in near equilibrium with its environment by means of high levels of homeorhetic feedback subsystems (p. 132).

Johnson is emphatic in making the claim that a living being is a process, not a thing, yet provides little reflection on what he means by this difference, arguing that it is better to avoid metaphysics. He proceeds instead to what he calls an Aristotelian notion of a living thing's good as its "functioning well as a being of the sort that [it is]" (p. 168). From here, it is a short jump to a virtue ethics, including a virtue of being "life-affirming" (p. 177).

With this background established, Johnson begins his foray into a number of the traditional issues of medical ethics, promising that his biocentric approach will illuminate these issues in new and significant ways. Anyone who surmised from the title of the book that Johnson's "life-centered" approach would mean anything like a "pro-life" view on these important issues, however, will be in for a rude awakening. While life is "future-oriented" and death is generally bad because it shuts off that future, Johnson argues that death becomes good for an organism when the organism becomes frustrated in achieving its life-purposes or cannot maintain its physiological integrity within a certain range. Since human purposes are partly determined by preferences and since the life-purposes to which Johnson refers are those of the individual organism, death becomes good for human beings when they are frustrated in achieving their chosen life-plans or are continuing to live only with great effort or at great cost. Hence, euthanasia (which he takes to cover both the foregoing of life-sustaining treatment and the active creation of a new lethal state with the specific intention of making an individual dead) can become a benefit for that individual. He avers that the only possible argument against euthanasia is a divine command theory that stipulates arbitrarily that the practice is wrong. Religious arguments aside, "when our overall life deteriorates to a point whereafter it is severely and irremediably incapable of returning to what, in its own terms, it needs to be, then it can be in its own interests to terminate" (p. 229).

Because of worries about possible abuse, Johnson argues that we should draw a line at involuntary active euthanasia, but that we should go so far as to permit so-called involuntary passive euthanasia. That is, physicians should be prohibited from killing patients against their wishes out of a beneficent motive, but permitted to forgo treatment for patients who prefer to continue to live but for whom it is clear to doctors and those around them that they have reached the point of being frustrated in achieving their own life-purposes so that death is really in their own best interests. He accepts the distinction between living human beings and persons and argues that the killing of human non-persons (such as those in the persistent vegetative state) is not wrong. Because morality and language are ambiguous and there is no clear distinction between what is life-affirming and life-negating, people should generally be free to make these decisions for themselves.

In discussing the rule of double effect, Johnson argues that what is really important is the rule's proportionality condition. Intentions matter somewhat, but ought to be broadly construed. Thus, he argues, euthanasia can be seen as justified by double effect because the person choosing euthanasia is really not intending death as a means of achieving relief from suffering but is intending to escape from a life of suffering with death as a foreseen but intended consequence.

Regarding ethical questions at the beginning of life, Johnson argues that "to dismiss the human embryo as being only a blob of jelly, having no higher moral status than other blobs of living jelly having similar currently realized capabilities or lack thereof is to fall into error both morally and biologically" (p. 241). Yet this moral status makes no apparent difference in his judgments about the morality of abortion, infanticide, or human embryonic stem cell research. This is because a human embryo, while living, is only a potential person and thus does not have the moral status of an actual person. Thus, "affirming life does not necessarily entail adherence to a supposed 'right to life'" (p. 259).

After a chapter discussing basic topics such as genes, DNA, evolution, genetic reductionism, and social Darwinism, Johnson turns to contemporary moral problems in research that touches on genetics and the beginning stages of human life. Since human embryos may be aborted, it follows that it is morally permissible to disaggregate human embryos to retrieve stem cells for research. While according to his "life-affirming" ethics it is better to use embryos leftover from in vitro fertilization than to create human embryos with the intention of destroying them for use in research, he concludes that creating human embryos to be destroyed in research would be justifiable if it proved necessary to help full human persons realize their interests in health and continued life. Cloning of human beings should be permitted, he argues, not only for research purposes but also to bring babies to birth, provided that we take precautions to prevent the commercialization and exploitation of these cloned human beings.

The final three chapters cover the ethics of human subjects research, Eastern wisdom for bioethics, and a chapter on the need for a more comprehensive bioethics that more fully takes account of the place of human beings in the entire web of life. The chapter on human subjects research concentrates on issues of informed consent, the use of placebos, and the notion of equipoise (the idea that it is morally permissible to experiment only if it is not known with relative certainty that there is a safe and superiorly effective treatment). The chapter on Eastern wisdom discusses the differences between Western individualism and Eastern communitarianism, and emphasizes Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism. The final chapter emphasizes human responsibility for all forms of life and decries our "speciesist" tendencies to privilege the human in our moral considerations.

For many reasons, the book is both interesting and frustrating. Its very biological approach to human life and to understanding its value is illuminating and refreshing, yet it is disappointing that Johnson takes no account of a voluminous literature on the philosophy of medicine and the nature of health and disease. There is no dialogue with this literature and that makes it difficult to see where his views fit. In fact, there is no dialogue with the vast literature on bioethics or the rule of double effect either, and the book would have been richer if its arguments could have been situated within these wider conversations. The promise that this life-affirming ethic could provide new insights into bioethics is intriguing, but in the actual discussion of particular ethical issues Johnson's life-affirming ethic appears to make no substantive difference. Each question is approached by a rather standard interest-maximizing consequentialism and the answers are more or less the same as those given by a whole host of Anglo-Australian utilitarians. If so, what is the point of being bio-centric? The encouragement to be more comprehensively life-affirming and ecological in bioethics is good advice, but Johnson does not move us beyond Peter Singer's warnings against speciesism. He emphasizes the need to be more biological, but then makes several biological errors, such as mistakenly discussing Huntington's disease as if it were an autosomal recessive disorder when it has a dominant pattern of inheritance. The writing is very approachable and clear, but it also sometimes sounds journalistic and is peppered with catchy phrases, a style that is unbecoming and probably not necessary in order to be accessible. There is a healthy attention to a variety of religious views, which appears progressive, but Western (and particularly Christian) views are often treated in a patronizing manner that undercuts this effort.

Nonetheless, the fundamental idea behind the book is new and interesting, and makes for very worthwhile reading even if the ultimate working out of these ideas must be left to future work.