A Mark of the Mental: In Defense of Informational Teleosemantics

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Karen Neander, A Mark of the Mental: In Defense of Informational Teleosemantics, MIT Press, 2017, 327pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262036146.

Reviewed by Manolo Martinez, Universitat de Barcelona


Karen Neander's is the first book-length defense of so-called producer teleosemantics. Teleosemantics is a naturalistic theory that aims at identifying sufficient conditions for a mental state to count as a representation, and, if it is, a procedure to ascertain its content. These mental contents, to a first approximation, should be identified with correctness conditions. For example, my belief that it is now raining in Barcelona, a paradigmatic example of a mental representation, has as content the proposition that it is raining in Barcelona: that is, conditions whereby the belief is correct (in fact, true) if and only if it is raining.

That teleosemantics is a naturalistic theory means, roughly, that it only makes reference to the sort of entities and relations that the relevant sciences (biology, psychology and neuroscience, most prominently) make reference to in their theories. In particular, the main teleosemantic insight is that semantic normativity (the fact that some representations count as correct and some others as incorrect in virtue of their meaning, p. 18) derives from the normativity underlying claims of biological function, and these latter claims are naturalistically unobjectionable: biology appeals at every turn to the distinction between normal functioning and malfunction, and to the fact that some devices are supposed to produce certain effects, but not others, even in cases in which they are not actually able to produce them (see p. 20f for a more formal outline of the kind of so-called proper functions appealed to in teleosemantics.)

Teleosemanticists apply the function-malfunction distinction to the question of mental content by focusing on the functions of the devices that produce and consume representations. The producer causes the tokening of the representation; the consumer uses it for whatever purposes downstream. In the most prominent teleosemantic account, Ruth Millikan's version of consumer teleosemantics (Millikan 1984, 2004, 2017), the function that is relevant in fixing the content of these representations is the consumer's: the idea, simplifying a great deal Millikan's sophisticated and intricate account, is that the content of representations should be fixed by how representations are taken, that is, by the uses they are put to. Neander's is by far the most developed version of producer teleosemantics, the view that the function that is relevant in fixing the content of representations is the producer's: it is what causes a representation (in the good cases, when the producer's function is fulfilled) that should have a bigger weight in fixing its content.

To see what the difference between producer and consumer teleosemantics amounts to, consider the following example, very often played in the literature on this topic and loosely based on Lettvin et al. (1959): a certain perceptual state P of a frog is caused to token by its producer whenever a small dark thing flies by in front of the frog. In turn, P causes its consumer to initiate a motor program that results in the frog lashing out its tongue and catching the small dark moving thing in question. The consumer-teleosemanticist would have us look at the use to which P is put by its consumer, and how it has resulted in an evolutionary benefit: it initiates preying behavior, which is good for the frog because small dark moving things in its environment, being flying bugs of some sort, are usually nutritious. Hence the content of P should be taken to be something along the lines of This is food. The producer-teleosemanticist, instead, would attend to the function of P's producer, which is supposed to respond to visual features of bugs by producing Ps. This makes P carry information about the visual features of bugs, and therefore fixes a content along the lines of This is a small dark moving thing.

Neander, a major figure in the field and the most prominent proponent of producer teleosemantics, has paid more attention to the actual scientific underpinnings of her views than other figures of comparable stature. For instance, it was she that, after two decades of philosophical discussion of feature detection in the frog's brain (where the amount of empirical detail was comparable to the one I have given above), finally offered an update and review of the relevant science (Neander 2006). This attention to empirical detail is now more common than it used to be in teleosemantics (a recent exemplar is the excellent Shea 2018), and Neander was doing it before anyone else.

While A Mark of the Mental is Neander's first book, she has been alluding to it in footnotes for at least ten years -- and publishing papers on these very topics for more than thirty. The book, unsurprisingly, covers a lot of ground that she explored before, piecemeal, in her previous writings. But she has made a huge effort to systematize the view, and to offer a full presentation of her take on teleosemantics -- which of course involves a substantial amount of new material. In this review I summarize the book's main tenets and make a few critical suggestions.

The first chapter does stage setting: Neander's understanding of the key notions in the debate (naturalism, content, function and teleosemantics, most importantly) is clarified, as is the modest scope (p. 24) of the theory to be developed: Neander aims at offering a teleosemantics for sensory-perceptual representations -- the ones that make our personal-level perceptual states correct or incorrect, faithful, illusory or hallucinatory, but also subpersonal states that keep track of, e.g., the orientation of edges. The (conceptual) content of thoughts, beliefs and desires is not part of the intended explanandum.

Chapter 2 defends the intended scope of the theory which, while modest, encompasses important phenomena: the kind of subpersonal perceptual representations with nonconceptual, or preconceptual, content discussed above are routinely posited in cognitive science. First, inferring normal-subject visual mechanisms from brain-deficit data (a common explanatory strategy in cognitive science) involves "a notion of malfunction-permitting function and a notion of error-permitting representation" (p. 34). Second, visual-system representations are intensional (p. 37), and intensionality is widely seen as evidence of intentionality. The chapter ends with the exposition of a "conundrum" to be answered in subsequent chapters: representations are causally efficacious, but this does not seem to be in virtue of their semantic properties -- rather, it seems to be in virtue of other properties, physical or biological, of the representational vehicles. The analogous conundrum, this time regarding the causal efficacy of functions, is presented in chapter 3: according to the kind of theory of functions that Neander favors, roughly, that an effect of a certain device, D, counts as D's function if D was selected for producing the effect in question. If this is so, why should scientists (interested in explaining the behavior of a certain system, here and now, regardless of its evolutionary history) be interested in proper functions? Neander's answer is that, first, a widespread explanatory strategy in biology involves making claims about dysfunction, or impaired function (p. 57): comparing actual behavior to that of "normal" or idealized systems is a good explanatory strategy in general. And, second, there is no dysfunction without normal functioning. Proper functions are thus tacitly appealed to in dysfunction-involving explanations.

The first three chapters, in a nutshell, argue that the theory to be subsequently developed pertains to a program, teleosemantics, that rests on coherent notions (chapters 1 and 3), and that it targets a real, important explanandum (chapter 2). Chapter 4 starts outlining Neander's positive theory (a version of producer teleosemantics as sketched above) and its defense. The chapter's main claim is that informational teleosemantics is supported by current cognitive science (p. 73f). As we saw above, producer teleosemantics relies on proper functions and information-processing as its two main ingredients. The main premises of the argument in favor of this claim, thus, are that proper functions are central to analyses of cognition in cognitive science; and that cognitive science postulates that cognition involves information processing. As before, support for the first premise comes from noting that appeals to malfunction, in the form of abnormal or impaired cognition, are commonplace in cognitive science. The support for the second premise is perhaps less clear -- examples from the relevant scientific literature are not offered in this section -- but the premise itself is largely uncontroversial.

Chapter 5 discusses an empirically informed variation on the frog-preying-on-bugs model of representation introduced above. Neander's version involves visual processing in toads, in particular the role of T5-2 neurons in their optic tectum (p. 108). She argues that some content attributions (that make reference to visual features) are preferable to others (involving, say, toad food) whenever the postulation of representations is intended to contribute to "information-processing explanations of the capacity of simple systems" (p. 98). Neander's goal is not to use her theory to establish this, but, rather, to show that the content attribution to be favored by her theory is independently plausible. She claims that some of what seem to be competing content attributions (involving, e.g., food) are often tailored to serve other explanatory goals, such as making sense of folk psychology.

Chapter 6 discusses response functions, the main normative component of the theory. Neander wants representations to have the function of carrying information. A common worry here is that functions are selected effects (Neander agrees), and that being caused by something or other (which is what carrying information more or less amounts to in her picture; more on that later) is not an effect -- selected or not -- of the representational vehicle. She presents her theory of response functions, which is designed to negotiate this difficulty: the main idea is that some functions are functions to "respond to something by doing something" (p. 126), i.e., "to be caused by something to do something" (p. 127). Neander argues that response functions can be selected for: e.g., producing melatonin (which in turn produces sleepiness) in response to the dimming of light is a better idea for many animals than doing it in response to the brightening of light, or than producing it at random. In the chapter's final section, the notion of information that Neander favors is also presented: "one event carries information about another if the second causes the first" (p. 142).

Chapters 7-9 investigate the simple proposal we have arrived at: "A sensory-perceptual representation refers to what is supposed to cause it" (p. 149). One important family of problems for teleosemantics, and other naturalistic accounts of mental content, is that the content-attributing recipes that these theories endorse seem to leave a great deal of indeterminacy. Going back to consumer teleosemantics and our frog example, while it is true that detecting food increased the fitness of frogs (warranting the This is food content attribution), it is also true that detecting bugs increased fitness equally well -- this is because most bugs in the frogs' environment are nutritious. If so, This is a bug is an equally good candidate for the content of the relevant perceptual state (cf. Fodor 1990). These final three chapters discuss six content-determinacy challenges along similar lines. The official theory to be tested against these challenges (which will be subsequently supplemented) is

CT: A sensory-perceptual representation, R, which is an (R-type) event in a sensory-perceptual system (S), has the content there's C if and only if S has the function to produce R-type events in response to C-type events (in virtue of their C-ness) (p. 151)

Chapter 7 takes up the first three content-determinacy challenges. With Neander, I'll use 'C' to refer to the content attribution we pre-theoretically favor, and 'Q' to refer to an alternative candidate the theory is supposed to filter out. The first challenge is that C and Q be locally co-instantiated. This is a version of the traditional challenge, rehearsed above, that, if snapping at bugs is fitness-conducive for toads, snapping at small, dark, moving things [SDMs] will be, too. Neander defends SDMs as the right attribution, because the toad's visual pathways are causally sensitive to SDMs as such, but not to bugs. The second challenge has to do with situations in which both C and Q are "causally implicated in the selection of the relevant cognitive . . . systems" (p. 159). Again here, Neander appeals to the property of being produced in response to C-type events in virtue of their C-ness: only visual features would meet this condition, for perceptual representations.

The third determinacy challenge is C and Q having been necessarily co-instantiated in the past -- as in green and grue. (Grue is the property of being green and having been observed before 2040, or else being blue.) Neander claims that perceptual representations have green and not grue as content because it is the former, not the latter property that visual systems have responded to in function-conferring occasions (the "good cases"). If you are to respond to grueness as such you need grueness to be making a difference: the system, for example, should be prepared to change its pattern of response from 2040 onwards. If it doesn't include a calendar, it's not responding to grue.

Chapter 8 adds a new component to the CT theory, based on the idea that "relations of second-order similarity are content-constitutive" (p. 175 -- a more formal characterization is on p. 185). The idea here is that devices can gain the function to respond to a whole range of values of an environmental variable in bulk, so to speak, by setting up a system of signals that is "analogically" related to the environmental variable in question. In Neander's understanding of analogicity, "(some) relations of similarity and difference among the represented elements mirror (some) relations of similarity and difference among the representing elements and vice versa (in a content-constitutive way)" (p. 181). In this sense, analog contrasts with arbitrary, not with digital. If a representational system is analog in this sense, there might be special cases in which the content-fixing response functions are functions to produce "the inner analog, relative to the system" (p. 195). Neander calls this refinement of her proposal CDAT (Causally Driven Analogs and Teleosemantics). These analog relations both help explain our pictorial intuitions about perception (p. 196f) according to which our perceptual experiences somehow "resemble" the perceived scene. They also explain "missing shade of blue" cases (p. 200f). Finally, it equips the theory to handle two further content-indeterminacy challenges: C being a determinate of Q, and C being a determinable of Q.

Chapter 9 deals with a last indeterminacy challenge, the so-called distality problem: how to choose a possible content C over another one Q, when Q is closer to the representation, R, in a C-to-R causal chain -- the problem, for example, of picking out 'cow' as the content of a certain perceptual representation, as opposed to the causally more proximal 'pattern of ambient light reflected from a cow'. This is a difficulty for CT because CT implies that, if the representation-producing system has the function to produce representations in response to Cs by responding to Qs, the representation will have both C and Q as contents (p. 220). The solution to this problem is adding, as a final refinement, the following distality principle to C(DA)T:

Distality Principle: A representation R refers to C and not to Q if R has the function of responding to Cs by responding to Qs, but not the function of responding to Qs by responding to Cs (paraphrased from p. 222).

This principle filters out light reflected from a cow as a content candidate because, plausibly, our perceptual apparatus has the function of responding to cows by responding to light patterns, but not the function of responding to light patterns by responding to cows. Neander claims that this principle does not destabilize the whole theory, for example, by pushing it towards contents that were discarded by C(DA)T precisely because the principle is intended to be applied after the main theory has already been applied, and only in order to adjudicate between different contenders, all equally good by the lights of C(DA)T.

CT plus CDAT plus the distality principle complete the theory of content defended in this book. It is the first full treatment of a causal theory of content in a long time and, as Neander reminds us throughout the book, perhaps the closest in spirit to Stampes's seminal (1977) theory. It is, as such, a good test of just how viable this approach is -- and it provides a good case that it is just as viable as other, more prominent teleosemantic approaches to mental content. Response functions, in particular, are a useful way of thinking of functions to produce representations, and provide a compelling response to the "selected effects" objection discussed above.

On the other hand, the situation is perhaps somewhat more complicated. To begin with, it is not true that consumer teleosemantics ignores response functions: Millikan already introduced the notion of relational proper function, "a function to do or to produce something that bears a specific relation to something else" (Millikan 1984, p. 39). The first example of a relational function that Millikan gave is the chameleon's "device . . . that is supposed to vary [the chameleon's] skin color in accordance with the color of what the chameleon sits on" (ibid.). This is plainly a response function in Neander's sense. Neander, prompted by Artiga (2015), admits as much in (ch. 6, fn 8), but doesn't explain what is, then, the point of contention between her and Millikan (in this respect). I suspect that part of the problem is that Neander often slides from talk of the response functions that representation producers have, to talk of the "information-carrying functions" of representations themselves (p. 146). I don't think that these purported information-carrying functions of representations are an innocent consequence of the response function of their producers. Representations will typically carry information if they are produced by a device with the right response function, but it does not follow that they will typically also have the function to carry it. For example, it is clear enough that, as Neander wants, a device might have the function to produce melatonin at night (as opposed to during daytime, or at random), but it does not follow from this that melatonin itself has the function to carry information about the time of day, as opposed to the function to cause sleepiness.

It turns out that Neander has a somewhat idiosyncratic understanding of what it takes for something to have an information-carrying function: "To say that sensory-perceptual representation of type R has the function to carry information about stimuli of type C is to say that the system that produces Rs has the function to produce them (i.e., change into R-states) in response to C-type stimuli." (p. 146). Again, this boils down to a notion of function that the opposing camp already recognizes: information-carrying functions in Neander's sense are what Millikan (1984, p. 41) calls derived proper functions: functions had by adapted devices, such as Neander's representations, in virtue of the functions had by the devices that produced them. While there is, no doubt, substantial disagreement between Millikan's consumer and Neander's causal-informational brands of teleosemantics, the disagreement does not lie in which kinds of functions do or do not exist.

Neander does a commendable job of discussing and dealing with different content-determinacy challenges -- her taxonomy of six different such problems is already useful in its own right. Still, it might be argued that CT is not immune to some of the traditional determinacy challenges for teleosemantics. The reason is that a substantial part of the determinacy burden is carried, as we have seen, by the "in virtue of their C-ness" clause in the formulation of CT. Neander's idea is that C should figure in the content of a representation R if C-ness is a causally efficient property in eliciting the system's response that results in R. The account effectively borrows content determinacy from causal-efficacy determinacy. This is not a problem in and of itself, but it does mean that contents cannot be more determinate than causal efficacy allows -- and causal efficacy is rather indeterminate.

 On the one hand, causal claims are notoriously context sensitive (Menzies 2001, sec. 3.1) and, for example, plausibly, there are contexts in which the claim that the visual system of toads is responding to bugs by responding to their visual features is perfectly justified -- in fact, Lettvin and colleagues present themselves as describing "a system for detecting an accessible bug" (Lettvin et al. 1959, p. 1951, my emphasis). This, contra Neander, would make CT warrant bug as the content of the firings of T5-2 neurons in the toad's visual system. On the other hand, sometimes Neander appears to have an operationalized notion of causation in mind, one tied to discrimination capabilities that "a normal toad has, and not one that its actual capacity merely approximates" (p. 119). Leaving aside whether this is a good understanding of causation, I suspect it interacts with Neander's solution to the distality problem, as discussed in chapter 9 and above: if we are supposed to focus on the discriminatory capacities that T5-2 neurons have, not just approximate, it is hard to see how we are going to zero in on the (distal) visible features of bugs, as Neander wants, as opposed to patterns of light impinging on the retina, or even the state of neurons upstream from the optic tectum. If we assume, with Neander, that there is a linear causal chain from bugs to T5-2 (p. 227), a well-known result in information theory, the so-called "data-processing inequality" (Cover and Thomas 2006, p. 34) guarantees that T5-2 will carry at least as much information about (more proximal) patterns of light than it does about (more distal) visible features of bugs.

The data-processing inequality, a central result in information theory, should be very much on topic given Neander's ambition to develop an "informational teleosemantics". Neander herself, though, as we have seen, understands information simply as causation. Calling her account 'informational', in a way, sells it short: mere causation is a much thinner foundation than information (with the very rich mathematical theory of information to describe it) upon which to build an account of mental representation. Neander's project is very interesting precisely because it shows that, using causation as the main building block, we can make significant progress in our understanding of representation. Thinking of the account as merely causation-based, which it is, has the additional benefit of terminological clarity: "information" would probably be best saved for the quantity that is studied by information theory in the Shannonian tradition.

Neander's excellent book should be studied by cognitive scientists and philosophers of mind and biology working on representation and intentionality. It should help bring the producer side of things into much needed focus. The process through which representations are created is at least as important to fixing their content as what representations are for.


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