A Materialist Metaphysics of the Human Person

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Hudson, Hud, A Materialist Metaphysics of the Human Person, Cornell University Press, 2001, 202 pp, $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-8014-3889-6.

Reviewed by Eric Olson, Cambridge University


The metaphysics of personal identity is rarely approached in a systematic way. The usual practice is to start with a question such as what our identity over time consists in, and canvass our opinions about a range of fictional “test cases” (is it the same person?). The view that does best by those opinions is then taken to answer the question. Whether that view fits into any wider metaphysical picture is left open.

Hudson is more conscientious. He begins by developing a general ontology of material objects in response to a broad range of metaphysical considerations, most of which have nothing to do with people in particular. He then asks which of the things in this ontology we are. Our identity conditions and other properties of philosophical interest, he concludes, are the ones that the general metaphysic assigns to those objects. In this way he arrives at a view of personal identity that not only gives plausible accounts of who is who in science-fiction stories, but also is compatible with what he takes to be the best metaphysical principles all things considered.

If more philosophers adopted this strategy, debates on personal identity would be a good deal more fruitful. I recommend Hudson’s book as an example of how metaphysics ought to be done. I can recommend it on other grounds too. It is beautifully written and very clear. It is packed with insightful arguments. And it is refreshingly honest. Most authors leave it to the reader to work out the implausible consequences of their views. Hudson openly concedes them. He merely argues that they are not as bad as they seem. I would happily buy a used car from him—though it may not be the car he recommends.

For the most part, Hudson’s metaphysic is the familiar ontology of temporal parts, or “four-dimensionalism”. For every time when a thing exists, there is a different temporal part or “stage” of it located at just that time. For the usual reasons, this is combined with universal composition (any things whatever have a mereological sum) and a counterpart-theoretic view of de re modality.

But there are interesting differences. We can illustrate them by setting out Hudson’s response to what Peter Unger has called the problem of the many, which takes center stage in the book. Call the elementary particles that now compose you (or the particle-stages that timelessly compose you) the xs. Now consider the ys, which are identical with the xs except that they exclude one of the xs near your periphery and include one particle near your periphery that is not one of the xs. Universal composition implies that the ys too compose something. Call it Rival. (Hudson argues that the problem can be stated without universal composition as well.) Rival is not you, it seems, for you and he have different parts. Yet he is virtually indistinguishable from you. So he too ought to be rational and self-conscious. He ought to be a person. So there are two people wherever we thought there was just one. Far more than two, in fact, for Rival was only an example. There are more people under your skin than you can shake a stick at.

Most four-dimensionalists accept this conclusion and propose linguistic hypotheses to make it more palatable. When people and other things relate to one another as the many do, we “count them as one” for ordinary purposes. Only metaphysicians care about how many numerically different people there are. The ordinary, non-philosophical belief that I would express by saying, “I am alone in the house,” implies only that all of the people in the house share their thoughts with me, not that they are identical with me.

Dissatisfied with this orthodoxy, Hudson makes the bold claim that Rival is you. How can that be, when you and he have different parts? Well, the same thing can have different parts at different times. In the same way, Hudson says, a thing can have different parts in different places. The particle that is one of the xs but not one of the ys is a part of you at the place where the xs are, but not a part of you where the ys are. To say that you and Rival must be two because you and he have different parts is no better than saying that you and the person sitting in your chair five minutes ago must be two because (owing to metabolic turnover) you and he have different parts. Things have parts, and properties, relative to places as well as times—or, on the temporal-parts ontology, relative to spacetime regions. Thus, what appear to be different things with different parts and different locations are in reality just one thing, which is composed of more than one set of parts and exactly located in more than one place at once. And what goes for Rival goes for the rest of the many. Despite appearances, they are one. Hudson calls the view “partism”.

I find this view deeply unsettling. To begin to get a sense of just how strange it is, consider the Ship of Theseus. (I assume everyone knows the story.) The partist could solve the puzzle by saying that the repaired ship is the reconstructed ship. It simply has different parts in different places. In the museum, it is made up entirely of old planks. At sea, it is composed entirely of new ones. These properties are no more incompatible than being made out of old planks last year and being made out of new ones now are incompatible.

To be fair, Hudson would reject this application of his view. Although the reconstructed ship and the repaired ship overlap (on the temporal-parts ontology they have their earliest stages in common), they don’t overlap enough to warrant identifying them (133f.). That may sound sensible. But as far as I can see Hudson has no principled reason for this sensible view. He can only insist that a partist account of the Ship of Theseus is implausible.

‘Implausible’ seems to me the wrong word. Imagine a museum guide pointing to the reconstructed hulk and saying, “See that ship? At this very moment, out at sea, it is sailing past the Pillars of Hercules.” We should ordinarily take this to be a case of “deferred ostension”: the guide is referring to the ship at sea by pointing to something else that represents it, as he might by pointing to a picture of it. But suppose he insists that the ship confined to the museum and the ship at sea are numerically identical. Most of us would find this claim unintelligible. Yet anyone who understands partism will find it perfectly intelligible, even if it is false.

I cannot predict a large following for partism. But never mind. Accepting partism won’t get us far, for another version of the problem of the many appears immune to a partist solution. Consider the object made up of all and only those particles that compose you except one near your periphery. Call that object Less. Or the object made up of your particles plus one near your periphery that isn’t a part of you: More. Less, Hudson says, is a proper part of you, and More has you as a proper part. If you were identical with Less, or with More, you would be a proper part of yourself at some region of spacetime, which is absurd. Partism enables us to identify you with Rival only because neither you nor he is a part of the other. So More and Less are distinct from you. And there are many more where they came from. They are all so much like you that they ought to count as people. Thus, once again there are vastly more people than we thought there were. In short, even if partism can dispense with the “partly overlapping many” represented by Rival, it is powerless against the “nested many” represented by Less and More.

In fact it is not obvious why Hudson should make this concession. Less, we supposed, is a part of you at a certain place, and you are a part of More at a certain place. But why a proper part? A proper part of something is just a part of it that is not identical with it. And partism seems to do away with the only reason we had for supposing that Less and More are not you, namely the principle that things with different parts are distinct. Of course, if you were Less, you would be larger than yourself. But the partist can say that you are simply larger in one place than you are in another.

I suspect that the reason Hudson shrinks from applying partism in this case is that it would solve too many problems. Once we start identifying things with what we thought were their parts, we won’t know where to stop. If you are identical with Less, why isn’t a whole cat identical with its “tail complement”? Why isn’t a temporally extended person identical with his earlier half? I think a similar worry stops Hudson from giving a partist account of the Ship of Theseus. Without a principled account of when, in general, overlapping things are identical, partism threatens to undermine all our beliefs about the distinctness of overlapping objects.

In any case, Hudson’s solution to the problem of the nested many is this. No person, he says, can be a proper part of another. Since you are a person, Less and More are not people. Nor can any thinking being be a part of another. Since you can think, Less and More cannot think. There are many things very similar to you sitting in your chair, but only one of them is a person, or indeed a thinker.

Now merely saying that no person or thinker can be a part of another, even if it is true, tells us nothing about which of those beings is the unique person. It implies that if you are a person, Less and More are not. But it also implies that if Less is a person, you and More are not; and so on. And it provides no grounds for choosing among these alternatives. Hence, it provides no explanation of why Less and More and the vast number of other beings that share your thinking apparatus should be unable to think.

Here Hudson makes another bold conjecture. Consider the human organism sitting in your chair. It started out as an unthinking embryo, and may end up as an unthinking vegetable. It has temporal parts that not only cannot think but also have nothing to do with your ability to think. That makes it too big, Hudson says, to be a thinker. Now consider that temporal segment of you that extends from midnight yesterday until midnight tonight: your “today-part”. It supports your ability to think throughout that period. But it is a proper part of a larger being of which the same is true. That makes it too small to be a thinker. A thinking being, then, is a maximal aggregate of “thought-supporting” parts that relate causally to one another in the right way. (The final requirement is to prevent something made up of your first half and my second half from being a thinker.) That tells us which of the many nested candidates is the unique thinker and why.

This has some surprising consequences. First, it means that whether a thing can think depends in part on what neighbors it has. Indeed, whether a thing can think at a given time can depend on what happens later. All that stops your first half from thinking is the existence of your second half. This is hard to believe. How can something with a perfectly normal human nervous system, an appropriate causal history, and a surrounding community of thinkers be unable to think? How could something going on somewhere else, with no causal effect on what happens here, prevent it from using its brain to think?

The proposal also deprives Hudson of the usual four-dimensionalist solution to the so-called problem of temporary intrinsics, namely that a thing has a property at a time insofar as the temporal part of it located at that time has the property simpliciter. That is the most common reason for accepting four-dimensionalism in the first place. Hudson cannot accept it because he believes that you think now even though no temporal part of you located now thinks.

Hudson denies that a thing can think if it has temporal parts that don’t support thought (embryonic stages, for instance). That suggests that anything that has parts not directly involved in thought will be unable to think. We ordinarily take ourselves to extend all the way out to our skin. But most parts of your anatomy are no more involved in thinking than your animal’s embryonic stages are. It seems to follow that we are brains—or rather temporal parts of brains. Strictly speaking, you weigh around three pounds and are located between your ears. Unless you are a brain surgeon, you never see yourself, or anyone else. We see people’s bodies: organisms inhabited by intelligent brains, yet which are themselves no more intelligent than trees. But we never see people.

Finally, Hudson’s account of which of the nested many is the unique thinker—you—relies on the assumption that a thinker must be a maximal aggregate of appropriately interrelated, thought-supporting parts. Proper temporal parts of you can’t think because they are not maximal thought-supporters. But the ability to have experiences arose earlier in your development than your ability to think. Speaking loosely, you were sentient before you were rational. You are not a maximal aggregate of experience-supporting parts. And what goes for thought and personhood ought to go for sentience as well: only maximal aggregates of experience-supporting parts ought to be sentient. So although there is only one sentient being sitting in your chair, it isn’t you. It has you as a part, but also includes fetal and infantile stages that are not parts of you.

This means that you think, but you don’t feel. In fact nothing is both intelligent and conscious (though something could be, if it lacked any unthinking fetal or senile stages). When you think you are in pain, the true sufferer is something else. The illusion is due to the fact that the sentient being sitting in your chair shares most of its parts with you, so that his pains and your thoughts interact causally just as they would if they had a common subject.

For that matter, I learned to do philosophy well after I began to exist. I am not a maximal aggregate of parts that support the ability to do philosophy. I ought to wonder whether I am the real author of this review.

This strikes me as a reductio ad absurdum of Hudson’s view. Hudson will tell us not to call a view absurd until we’ve seen the alternatives. That may be good advice. But his complaints about rival views pale in comparison with this sort of trouble. It may be hard to believe that a vast number of thinkers share your thoughts and experiences. But can you believe that there is just one thinker there, and one experiencer, but they aren’t the same?

However that may be, the problems Hudson contends with cannot be ignored. And his book shows brilliantly just how difficult they are.