A Nietzschean Bestiary: Becoming Animal Beyond Docile and Brutal

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Acampora, Christa Davis and Ralph R. Acampora (eds.), A Nietzschean Bestiary: Becoming Animal Beyond Docile and Brutal, Rowan and Littlefield, 2004, 344pp, $29.95 (pbk.), ISBN 0742514277.

Reviewed by Robert Guay, Temple University


Nietzsche called his sister “llama,” a nickname which, according to her, derived from a description in a children’s biology book. Such a book in the Nietzsche-Archiv declares that “the llama, as a means of defense, squirts its spittle and half-digested fodder at its opponent.”1 Thus we see Nietzsche, as he does frequently in his writings, drawing on the semantic resources made available by the investigation of animal nature and using them to illuminate human character. The editors of . Nietzschean Bestiary had the superlative idea to advance the progression from zoology to anthropology one step further: starting from Nietzsche’s myriad trope of animality, to construct a philosophical bestiary that illuminates not only the status of human animality but also that of our metaphorical resources in general. The result comprises twenty-five essays from twenty-three contributors, most of which are organized around a single creature (albeit no llama). These essays’ execution of the original idea is, on the whole, excellent. I do not think that they establish the two main conceits of the volume. But the volume nevertheless provides a vivid and diverse display of Nietzsche’s animal tropes that engages with broader philosophical concerns.

Although it needs no defense, the volume presents a twofold apology. One declared aim of the volume is to show that Nietzsche’s pervasive use of animal imagery is not accidental, and not merely rhetorical. Instead, “such images play an essential role in the properly philosophical development of ideas”(Acampora and Acampora xxi). The other of the volume’s main conceits is that an investigation of Nietzsche’s “animal imaginary” can “serve to illuminate historical developments of zoological constructs of other animals as well as self-conceptions of human animality”(Acampora and Acampora xxii). But it is not quite such a broad theoretical project that the editors seem to have in mind. The more specific program of the volume is rather to show that conceptions of animal and human are in fact “zoological constructs” in such a way as to undermine “anthropocentrism” and lead to a normative demand for a “magnanimous atavism”(R.R. Acampora 2). This call to atavism and the invocation of a tropics of animality are linked by their common interest in “overcoming the metaphysical”(Acampora and Acampora xiv; cf. also Stark 91 and Bergoffen 246). The animal imaginary becomes indispensable once we abandon the metaphysical distinction between veridical and non-veridical discourse; human speciesism is rooted in a benighted metaphysical picture of our special place in or outside of nature.

So while a tropics of animality might initially seem esoteric, it provides a new angle on a familiar set of concerns. As the editors suggest, the main issue raised here is what a naturalism of human nature amounts to. This is arguably the central issue in Nietzsche studies at present, and one in which the existential and the theoretical intersect. Nietzsche clearly places emphasis on the body, reminds us of our animal nature, depicts us as the product of natural determination in every aspect of our lives, and even calls for a return to or translation back into nature. But this leaves open the question of just what sort of conception of nature Nietzsche had in mind, and what implication it has for our self-understanding. One could, on one hand, adopt a strong version of determinism or fatalism, according to which Nietzsche’s project is to replace the human self-image as norm-governed or even norm-creating beings with one in which our behavior is entirely explained in terms of mechanical nature. On the other hand, one could follow Nietzsche’s cues about the human being as the “not yet determined animal” to an account in which humanity has historically cultivated its animal nature to become fully self-determining in such a way that the body, although it places a limit on or serves as a precondition of spontaneous freedom, does not undermine our autonomous agency. This main issue, further, intersects with the theoretical insofar as we wish to make claims about the status of a particular account of human nature, or, more generally, wonder about our ability to hold ourselves even to theoretical norms, or, by contrast, see even our beliefs as determinations of non-rational nature.

Nietzsche’s animal imaginary provides an excellent, albeit flawed, occasion to treat these issues. Consider this passage from perhaps the finest contribution to this collection, Lawrence J. Hatab’s essay on the satyr:

This … can be seen to mark a fundamental task of his work: how to think human culture and the forces of animal nature as an indivisible blend that departs from the Western conception of carnal nature as something to be transcended, mastered, or reformed. Nietzsche advocates the notion of homo natura, a return of humanity and philosophy to the primal forces of nature. Yet Nietzsche’s naturalism cannot be called a reductive naturalism according to scientific categories … nor is it a naturalism that assumes fixed essences or intrinsic purposes, nor is it a romantic “return to nature” that is nostalgic for a pre-cultural harmony… Nature, for Nietzsche, is a network of forces that cannot be exhausted by scientific categories or governed by essentialist dreams. Nature, especially in life forms, exhibits indigenous forces of striving, domination, and destruction (captured in Nietzsche’s concept of will to power). Yet Nietzsche’s naturalism is not a denial or subordination of culture. (Hatab 211f)

This is as subtle and nuanced a treatment of the issue of nature as one could ask for: it avoids extremes in favor of an “indivisible blend,” and connects a range of topics from Nietzsche’s historical development to science to will to power to Nietzsche’s affirmative project. Hatab, through the figure of the satyr, offers an integration of the fatalist and existentialist features of Nietzsche’s work that suggests a normative result: like satyrs, we should span the animal and the divine (cf. also Brobjer 183).

But this integration, as presented, is at least potentially dissatisfying. It does not clarify the main enigma, what it could mean for there to be a culturally-productive nature that is neither “scientific” nor “romantic.” The demands of satyrdom remain obscure. One could, moreover, dispute the integration altogether, in favor of either a divinely redemptive or causally-determined standpoint. And here, unfortunately, there is nothing but the image of the satyr to appeal to. And indeed, in Alan D. Schrift’s Spider essay and Nickolas Pappas’s Snake essay, we have reflections on the “impossibility of the symbolizing work”(Pappas 81) that we, or Nietzsche, demand of the animal imaginary. There seem to be two hazards here. One is that the imagery repeats “allegorically” work that must elsewhere be done “analytically”(Pappas 74). The images underdetermine the philosophical implications, and lack the resources for further specification: if you put one animal trope next to another, you do not end up with an agon (or little baby tropes) so much as something somewhere between a tableau vivant and a nature morte. The other, related hazard is that an animal taxonomy is a way to get “caught in a web of philosophical concepts”(Schrift 69). Pappas relates a hermeneutic issue from Thus Spoke Zarathustra to a familiar bugbear: “This story’s adder does not slither straight to an index card to be filed under ’enemy’ or ’knowledge’ or ’temptation.’ If anything, the desire to categorize it as uniquely symbolic betrays a habit of interpretive simplification, which is to say moralization”(Pappas 73).

I doubt, then, that strong philosophical claims about the animal imaginary can be sustained. But the tropes do illuminate a largely unarticulated philosophical dispute between two competing approaches. According to one, understanding our animal nature allows us to better understand, or amend, the cultural production of meanings that, consequent to a process of historical development, furnishes the possibility of human “sovereignty” or authenticity. According to the other, our animal nature means that we, like falling rocks or swarming bees, are determined not by ideals or reasons but exclusively by efficient causes; we are thus not only deceived about our particular self-image as agents and knowers, but no such image is even a candidate for accuracy. For the sake of convenience, I shall refer to the former approach as “Hegelian,” and the latter as “Humean.”

The Hegelian approach is never explicit, but Charles S. Taylor, in his Camel essay, comes closest, by invoking the necessary stages of “historical philosophy”(Taylor 34) and the “higher level of the development of Geist”(Taylor 32). The area of substantial agreement with Hegel is of course limited; it is, after all, a “tragic view” (Schank 144) that Nietzsche advocates. But nature, here, is explicable according to the teleological structure of historical memory, and capable of producing Geistigkeit, governed by geistige causes. Kathleen Marie Higgins, in her consideration of the historical Ass Festival, seems to share in this approach with a kind of List des Esels position: the “light-hearted amusement” effected by upheavals of meaning can produce a “spiritual transformation”(Higgins 109). And although he invokes Deleuze and Guattari, Gary Shapiro, in his ingenious labyrinth-looking-into-you version of the master-dog dialectic, provides a recognition argument that points to “liberation”(Shapiro 56). According to Shapiro, the dog tells us that “the ego is something that has been bred”(Shapiro 55): it is fully natural, subject to the discipline of training, and nevertheless a locus of biopower irreducible to natural relations.

The Humean approach is more common, and occasionally invoked by name (Domino 46, Weinstein 303). Brian Domino uses Nietzsche’s polyp analogy to articulate the psychological aspect of Humeanism: the I’m-looking-for-the-self-and-I-don’t-see-anything position. “On this account,” insists Domino, “the psyche is polyp-like, with each polyp arm representing a drive. Experience washes over the tentacles, accidentally nourshing some, while others ’will be neglected and starved to death’“(Domino 43). What one is, accordingly, is entirely the composite product of natural causes. Human self-governance and rational responsiveness is illusory; there is nothing but blind drives and the discharge of affects. I take this to be the meaning of the frequent refrain that “human psychology” is merely “a more complicated instance of animal psychology”(Conway 158f; cf. also Ham 200). And the point is even subtler than that, since the other aspect of this Humeanism is a thoroughgoing noncognitivism. This picture of human nature is not asserted as true; in fact, it is not even presented as representational at all. There is no question of the truth of Nietzsche’s position, only its causal efficacy. It “helps us flourish”(Domino 43), it “makes us feel the force”(Woodruff 200) of Nietzsche’s ideas, it “works…upon the reader”(Babich 267), it offers a kind of “treatment”(C.D. Acampora 285). Or, in a passage reminiscent of Hume’s distinction between the painter and the anatomist,2 Jennifer Ham suggests that what Nietzsche offers is “a poetic vision of the animal/human dynamic and his own version of the origin of human nature”(Ham 195).

The allegiance in approach here is not fundamentally to Hume, but, as an excellent Bibliographical Essay by Jami Weinstein explains, to the ideas of Deleuze and Guattari and other writers whom we might call, for convenience’s sake, postmodern. This postmodernism consists in replacing metaphysical conceptions of the self with one(s) characterized primarily in terms of multiplicity and becoming, therewith calling for a transformed relation to otherness. I cannot seriously address either this simplified postmodernism or Nietzsche’s own position here, but I offer three reservations. One stems from the Humean character of the arguments. Although, as Gary Shapiro’s two essays show, postmodernism need not be given a Humean construal, it risks being trite repetition if it turns out merely to be Humeanism without covering laws or thesis statements. Second, the points about multiplicity and becoming seem not so much an overcoming of metaphysics as an alternative metaphysics, one with the same claims of scope and constancy despite appearances to the contrary. Third, that we are always “becoming animal” and “becoming another,” even if true, would not have any normative implication. Anti-metaphysical positions are by their nature inert – at best they indicate that our beliefs are not grounded as we might have thought they were. And if something more substantial is meant by the emphasis on becoming, then whatever is recommended to us must already be transpiring.

If we are indeed always “becoming animal,” one thing that certainly does not follow is atavism. Whatever our animal nature, nothing “forces us to abandon the false order of rank in relation to animals”(Groff 22) or compels “a return to the beginning, to the animal”(Lemm 200). Even if human status is not secured by the Great Chain of Being, we might nevertheless maintain a distinct dignity on some other basis. To think otherwise would be profoundly ascetic: the unmotivated insistence that, as essentially nature, we have no right to our self-worth. This is not what any of the contributors are suggesting, but atavism is a difficult position to engage with. Not only is it hard to imagine any rationale for atavism, but it is not clear how to make sense of it apart from inverting one’s palms under one’s armpits and making monkey noises.

The most sophisticated version of atavism is provided by Paul S. Loeb. His Lion essay sustains a complex argument that Nietzsche, through Zarathustra, calls for leonine predatory violence against those who are taken to embody moral goodness. I cannot address the details of Loeb’s interpretive argument, but offer a reservation about the results:

Zarathustra articulates a positive suprapersonal task that will justify all of their combat and sacrifice. (Loeb 130)
Nietzsche has Zarathustra single out especially the ancient commandments “Thou shalt not steal!” and “Thou shalt not kill!”(section 10) – thus indicating that he and his warriors will themselves have to steal and kill in order to be able to create new values. (Loeb 131)

This seems to me a mistaken reading of Nietzschean animality. This inverts morality, so that the content is changed, but there remains an external source of law issuing imperatives, calling for sacrifice, and offering to redeem lives that are otherwise meaningless. The denial of commandments, I suggest, does not lead to immoral commandments, but to no commandments. And it would be pointless, I think, to prey on the morally good: the dispute with them is ideal, so disposing of bodies would not affect that.

Daniel W. Conway’s speculative natural history in his Beast of Prey essay is perhaps more useful, although I think that Conway’s account is in one respect confused. Conway insists that the genealogist of morals “must account for the development of human being from wild predator to domesticated herd animal”(Conway 159); he reads genealogy (and social contract theory) as offering a causal account, in which events are placed in a framework of natural regularities. But Conway imposes rational demands on the causal data, complaining that Nietzsche “helps himself to an obviously facile distinction”(Conway 162) and offers an explanatory event which is “like an unforeseen natural disaster”(Conway 162). But this is just how causal explanations work; they are, to use Nietzsche’s word, “stupid.” Conway seems to expect a convergence between nomic explanation and sense-making understanding. Such a hybrid account might, however, be true to Nietzsche’s genealogy. And Conway’s approach, of focusing on the history of beasts of prey rather than, say, master morality, has its advantages. Nietzsche, after all, does not advocate master morality, but does argue that we must, in some sense, recover the inner beast of prey for the sake of our affective or physiological health.

What this sense is, and what the stakes for our health are, remain unresolved. But this collection is an excellent place to begin an exploration of these issues.


1. Quoted by Walter Kaufmann, Nietzsche: Philosopher, Psychologist, Antichrist, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1974: 55.

2. David Hume, Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, section 1.