A Philosophical Retrospective: Facts, Values, and Jewish Identity

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Alan Montefiore, A Philosophical Retrospective: Facts, Values, and Jewish Identity, Columbia University Press, 2011, 201pp., $29.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780231153003.

Reviewed by Daniel Rynhold, Yeshiva University


The present book by Alan Montefiore, long-time tutor at Balliol College, Oxford, and now president of the Forum for European Philosophy at the London School of Economics, though not an autobiography or memoir in the traditional sense, nonetheless "bears many traces of its autobiographical origins" (vii). On a conceptual level, it is a sustained reflection on the interplay between two of his longstanding philosophical interests -- the fact/value distinction on the one hand and the nature of personal identity on the other. Specifically, he is interested in whether these two philosophical areas of concern -- which, he notes, generally yield distinct bibliographies in most philosophy programs -- might not be intimately connected. Might the facts of one's personal identity bridge the fact/value distinction by committing one to certain obligations?

At the same time, in relation to its quasi-autobiographical elements, Montefiore combines this study with the more personal and possibly even more vexed question of defining Jewish identity. The key question for Montefiore is whether the indisputable facts of his own Jewish identity commit him to certain values; to certain things that he ought and ought not to do. And one of the central retrospective elements is his coming to understand his earlier philosophical preoccupations as a conceptually refined mirroring, whether conscious or not, of his real life struggles with this more personal question - as Montefiore puts it, "philosophy may very often start before it knows itself as philosophy" (ix). It is a book therefore that brings Nietzsche's remark that every great philosophy is "the personal confession of its author and a kind of involuntary and unconscious memoir,"[1] to a high degree of discursive consciousness; and as such it is a book that could only have issued from the pen of a philosopher drawing upon the accumulated wisdom of a distinguished philosophical career.

While the book is relatively short, it is multi-faceted, with the material therefore so difficult to contain that Montefiore appends an extended postscript to deal further with some of the philosophical issues bubbling beneath -- sometime overflowing onto -- the surface. But this is not accidental. It reflects an "anticompartmentalizing view of philosophy" (x), a view that emerges fully as the book develops, whereby philosophy is characterized by its "ultimate lack of any sharp boundaries" (161). In a sense this is likely to be at once the book's greatest strength and greatest weakness, depending on the reader's own philosophical sensibility. Nailing my colors to the flag, Montefiore's general view is one that I share, and thus while the book may strike some as overambitious, I found it to be a fascinatingly nuanced, dignified and, at certain points, even quite moving account of these complex (and in the Jewish case often emotive) issues.

Following a brief introduction and first chapter on the fact/value distinction, Montefiore turns at greater length in chapter two to questions of identity. At the most mundane level the "fact" that I am a university professor commits me to, for example, turning up to teach certain classes at certain times. In this way, facts regarding personal identity can clearly be seen to yield obligations. But we each wear many such hats that bring specific obligations in their wake. Montefiore's question turns on whether any hat "can ever be so tightly attached to a person's head as to make it impossible to conceive of him or her without it" (24). While admitting that it makes no sense to view certain biological facts about us as mere hats of choice, many of our social roles are of precisely this nature: I can decide to take them on, and can equally re-assess such decisions, with all of the attendant consequences.

The central question that is formulated and reformulated, at times a little repetitiously, throughout the chapter and the remainder of the book pertains to how Jewish identity fits into this picture. For while we can decide to step away from a given social role, and to step outside of the forms of social life to which it is attached, Montefiore asks whether it makes "uncontroversially intelligible sense" (30) for a Muslim to unilaterally declare himself a Christian or indeed for Montefiore himself to "determine for myself what my obligations should be to what [the elder generation] understood as the tradition?" (30). The quirk, however, that Montefiore's Jewish identity introduces, and one that is not always explicitly acknowledged in passages such as that just excerpted, is his apparent desire, in some "not very definite sense but nonetheless beyond all possible doubt" (126), to continue to identify with his socially and biologically given Jewish identity while rejecting what his family took to be the responsibilities that followed from so identifying. While a director of a company can retire or resign and divest himself of the responsibilities associated with the position, surely he cannot divest himself of those responsibilities while still claiming to be the director. And yet this, to an extent, seems to be Montefiore's position vis-à-vis Jewish identity. To what, then, could the nature of such an identity amount? This is the issue to which Montefiore devotes the three central chapters of the book, which address the issue from a variety of perspectives.

Montefiore first discusses this issue regarding the extent to which one can demur to a self-identity from the group identity that is given by others. For Jews in the twentieth century this is a particularly emotive issue. The Nazi criterion for being a Jew -- a single Jewish grandparent -- acknowledged neither traditional Jewish legal (halakhic) criteria for identification as a Jew (matrilineal descent or conversion) nor self-declarations eschewing one's Jewish identity. Not taking one's Judaism to be essential to one's personal identity was hardly a matter of relevance for those caught up in the unspeakable evils of the Nazi regime. Coming from the opposite direction altogether, Montefiore notes the intra-Jewish disputes in which Orthodox Judaism refuses to accept both those converted to Judaism by non-Orthodox procedures and those identified as Jewish within Liberal Judaism by way of patrilineal descent. In this case positive self-identification does not correspond to group identification, at least by certain influential groups. The point at this stage of the discussion is Montefiore's central contention that issues of personal identity are "caught up in all sorts of social entanglements" (70), an extension of a Wittgensteinian anti-private language argument that appears at the beginning of the book and reappears in various guises throughout. Montefiore argues that it makes no sense for one to create one's own private or individual criteria of meaning independent of all forms of life -- including therefore personally identifying as Jewish in a manner that is cut off from all social endorsement: "neither 'inner emotional choice' nor 'labeling by the outside world' can in the last resort claim complete conceptual independence of all reference to the other" (71). For Montefiore the two are inevitably intertwined.

But what then becomes of Montefiore's Jewish identity in the absence of the criterial obligations demanded by his family and community? In analyzing his disagreements with his family over whether he was obligated by their standards, he notes that the problem was that neither could "make 'proper' sense of . . . the fact that the other seemed unable to comprehend what each of us took to be the basic logical or conceptual incoherence of what the other was maintaining" (31). What he comes to understand over the course of his philosophical career -- and the most significant meta-philosophical thread running through the book -- is that one person's "conceptual incoherence" is another's "analytic truth". Thus, Montefiore argues that his claim to be free of such obligations makes perfect sense in the "social-cum-conceptual context . . . within which individuals are seen as ultimately and irreducibly responsible for 'choosing' or determining their own ruling values" (45). His assertion of independence from his Jewish obligations is not therefore some anomalous form of "private meaning" devoid of a social context, but an assertion grounded in a concept of the self that makes sense within a particular form of norm-governed community based on such Enlightenment-tinged values. The issue, however, was that this notion of selfhood did not make sense within the norm-governed community which gave his family their primary frame of meaning and practice. But the dawning realization for Montefiore was that neither conception was the inevitable result of some neutral objective conceptual analysis. While he had once thought that his identity was a simple matter of fact to be determined by rational argument, he came to realize that there were

simply too many ways in which such terms as value, fact, norm, identity . . . can be pushed around in their relations with each other . . . for it to be at all plausible that any one way of ordering them and their surrounding networks might stand as the only intellectually coherent and 'perspective-invariant' one (130).

Ultimately, Montefiore has come to reject the view that philosophy provides the conceptual resources to resolve disagreements in a single and absolutely authoritative rational manner. In its place, he believes that the "seriously clarifying role for careful reasoning and analysis" (130) that is the role of philosophy reveals belief in such universally clear cut answers to be chimerical. And his very recognition of the interplay between meaning and social-cum-conceptual context means that the basic misunderstanding between himself and his family was no longer quite such a mystery to him. It made their dispute no less irresolvable; but it did show that the lack of resolution was not a function of anyone's rank irrationality or lack of philosophical acumen.

What though of Montefiore's Judaism? For while he has a context in which he can maintain his sense of self despite his disavowal of his Jewish obligations, in what sense could such a disavowal make sense in a Jewish context as a form of Jewish identity? A chapter devoted to secular Judaism provides a semblance of an answer, since the emergence of a secular option within Judaism provides precisely the necessary social context for his particular form of affiliation. Yet in his discussion of the tension between Judaism's claim to being a religion of universal truth and yet the religion of a particular nation, Montefiore raises the concern that a reductive universalist account of Judaism appears to eliminate any ultimate justification for Jewish particularity, a recurring critique of the liberal Judaism of his grandfather Claude Montefiore, who was instrumental in foundation of liberal Judaism in England and who looms large in the background of much of the discussion. The problem this yields in turn is the sustainability of secularist and universalist versions of Judaism, and thus the prospects for his own secular form of Jewish identity. The longevity of such universalist or secular Jewish endeavors is, as Montefiore notes, ultimately an empirical question. Nonetheless, a running theme is his disarmingly honest assessment for the prospects of such forms of Jewish identity.

Montefiore emphasizes time and again that a secular Jewish identity is ultimately parasitic on "the continuing existence of a committed religious center to which it could see itself and be seen as marginal" (95). Thus his dignified defense of secular Jewish identity is combined with his airing of concerns over its sustainability, at least in the diaspora, without such a religious center, yielding a paradox for secular Jews who reject particularistic forms of Judaism while simultaneously having to affirm them if they are to continue to exist. The question as to whether this paradoxical yet very human wish to retain his Jewish identity and yet secede from any religious definition is ultimately self-defeating remains hanging in the air however, yielding an elegiac undercurrent to the discussion.

While he makes a brief, though it appeared to me rather less robust assertion of a mutual relationship of dependence between the secular and religious (112-3), he does implicitly lay a similar challenge at the door of the religious center, in particular its Orthodox occupants, or at least those within it who engage the world around them and have an important stake in the very value of individual autonomy that gives Montefiore's identity its context. For those who accept such a value will surely find it difficult to claim that all Jews are compelled to observe their particular form of religious observance. A living and intuitive commitment to pluralism will for them be in tension with traditional covenantal understandings that obligate all Jews in the observance of the traditional commandments. As such, they have no greater equilibrium between theory and life than their secular counterparts. But Montefiore's point is that such is the human (and philosophical) condition. To be the locus of this tension between universal and particular "is what characterizes not only Jews but every human being as such" (80). According to Montefiore -- following his aforementioned Wittgensteinian line in combination with a dual-aspect reading of Kant -- we occupy various conceptual schemes that, while incompatible and thus incapable of being held before the mind's eye all at once, are nonetheless crucial to our functioning as reflective human beings.

The fact that abstract conceptual reasoning simply cannot resolve these tensions might be deeply frustrating from a philosophical perspective, though as the twentieth-century Jewish philosopher Emil Fackenheim noted, even if the "Great systems of Western thought" might have been found out, that still leaves us with the not inconsiderable task of "the systematic labor of thought."[2] But as frustrating as it might be to some, in the eyes of this reviewer, it is probably true. At this point, however -- if I may be permitted a brief autobiographical comment in relation to this quasi-autobiographical book -- I should admit that I am probably at once the most and least appropriate reviewer for a book such as this. Given that both Montefiore and I were brought up in self-aware Jewish families, are both Oxbridge philosophy graduates who went on to careers in academia, and both maintain our (different) forms of Jewish identity, in our sharing as many "forms of life" as we do it might not be a coincidence that we come to similar conclusions regarding the nature and limits of philosophy. Indeed, having dealt with the more philosophical aspect of the discussion, it is of more than passing interest to note the parallels between Montefiore's ideas and those found in much contemporary Jewish thought.

Both Montefiore's pluralism and his notion of the "ineliminable polar tensions which characterize the human situation" (134), are paralleled in the work of the most prominent modern Orthodox Jewish philosopher Joseph B. Soloveitchik (1903-1993), in particular in Soloveitchik's epistemological pluralism[3] and his notion that both the human condition as such and the religious experience in particular are "fraught with inner conflicts and incongruities."[4] In arguing for a philosophical method that he terms "descriptive hermeneutics," Soloveitchik is similarly skeptical about the potential for pure philosophy to put an end to our disputes once and for all. As Soloveitchik notes, our interpretations "can never be considered ultimate."[5] Indeed, despite coming from the opposite end of the Jewish spectrum to that of Montefiore, Soloveitchik similarly articulates the tension between the universal and particular in a context that recalls the earlier point regarding the tension between Orthodoxy and pluralism. Thus for Soloveitchik "religious tolerance asserts itself in the knowledge of the existence of a variety and plurality of God-experiences and in the recognition that each individual is entitled to evaluate his great unique performance as the most redeeming and uplifting one."[6]

Thus, while Montefiore begins his book by noting that his Jewish struggle was given conceptual shape by his philosophical endeavors, what strikes one on reading the work and noting these parallels with contemporary Jewish thought is the extent to which his Judaism might have simultaneously given his philosophical sensibility its conceptual shape. Indeed, though entirely aptly named a retrospective, this book might equally be seen as a companion piece to the work of one of his late friends and colleagues, Bernard Williams's Judaism and the Limits of Philosophy. Without wishing to make the clearly absurd claim that being Jewish is either a necessary or sufficient condition of agreement with Montefiore's metaphilosophy, on reading this book one cannot help but wonder what it is about the modern Jewish experience that has taken so many of its philosophical expositors in this direction. Montefiore and Soloveitchik both understand that real life is far too messy an affair for its disputes to be resolved by some form of philosophical alchemy. While philosophy might not therefore eliminate disputes, the hope is that, even without the false hope provided by the illusion of universalist reductions, a more perspectivist model might nonetheless yield an understanding of the roots of these tensions and help us cope more peaceably with the at times inevitable mutual incomprehension.

[1] Friedrich Nietzsche, Beyond Good and Evil, tr. W. Kaufmann (New York: Random House, 1966), §6.

[2] Emil Fackenheim, To Mend the World (Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 1982), 5.

[3] Articulated in Joseph B. Soloveitchik, The Halakhic Mind (New York: The Free Press, 1986).

[4] Joseph B. Soloveitchik, The Lonely Man of Faith (New York: Doubleday, 1992), 2.

[5] The Halakhic Mind, 73-4.

[6]Joseph B. Soloveitchik, Community, Covenant, and Commitment: Selected Letters and Communications of Rabbi Joseph B. Soloveitchik (ed.), Nathaniel Helfgot (Ktav: New York, 2005), 22.