A Philosophy of Culture: The Scope of Holistic Pragmatism

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Morton White, A Philosophy of Culture: The Scope of Holistic Pragmatism, Princeton University Press, 2005, 216pp, $18.95 (pbk), ISBN 0691123985.

Reviewed by Newton Garver, University of Buffalo


More than half a century ago, when Quine was in Oxford to give his Locke Lectures, he visited the seminar of Grice and Strawson to answer questions about his historic "Two Dogmas" paper. It was an intense and lively session, but inconclusive. Fresh from the US, I thought Quine's performance had been masterful and decisive, but my fellow British students thought that he had evaded all the issues. It was a puzzling cultural clash, into which I have gained considerable insight by reading Morton White's A Philosophy of Culture. White's philosophy of culture combines a staunch pragmatism with a distinctive American flavor. It is difficult to believe that any of those British fellow students of mine could have written it, however much they may have steeped themselves in American pragmatism.

White combined with Quine and Goodman in a powerful onslaught on the distinction between analytic and synthetic truths in the middle of the twentieth century. Rejection of that distinction, and of any stout conception of synonymy, remains one of the pillars of White's holistic pragmatism. Nonetheless he overall differs substantially from both Quine and Goodman, being perhaps closer to William James than to either of these contemporaries. Even though James lacked the logical tools incorporated into pragmatism in the second half of the twentieth century, he made room for religious as well as sensory experience, thereby opening the way for the breadth needed by a philosophy of culture.

White's pragmatism rejects any dichotomy, a point on which Peirce is not an altogether reliable ally but on which there is common ground among James, Dewey, Quine, Goodman, and White, with some tentative support from Edwards and Emerson. The attack on the distinction between analytic and synthetic truths is the centerpiece of this commitment, and White adds other dimensions through his learned and instructive discussions of others, especially James and Dewey. It is in the first place through incorporating contributions of James and Dewey that White brings feelings of beauty, goodness, and metaphysical presence into the scope of his sense of culture, thereby making his pragmatism holistic.

While the natural scientist tries to work a manageable structure into a flux of sensory experience, I believe the moralist tries to work a manageable structure into a flux composed of both sensory experiences and feelings of moral obligation. (6)

The holism means that White intends to comprise the whole of human experience within his pragmatism, not just the scientific element, and to do so without acknowledging any essential difference in the way we decide upon different beliefs, nor any knowledge that is not experiential.

Since holism and pragmatism are familiar themes, the principal aim of this work is to argue for a much broadened scope for holistic pragmatism. White therefore presents a case for including religion (in the personal sense in which it is discussed by James and Whitehead), art and aesthetics (as discussed by Dewey and Goodman), history, law (where he embraces Holmes, with reservations, against Hart), and politics (by means of an exegesis of Rawls). It is the increased scope that makes holistic pragmatism plausible as a philosophy of culture.

Throughout the book White draws on various philosophers to support his perspective, including not only the well-known pragmatists but also the French empiricist Pierre Duhem and early American philosophers Jonathan Edwards and Ralph Waldo Emerson.

The main opponents of White are rationalists and logical empiricists. A rationalist is one who thinks there is knowledge that does not depend on experience. Descartes is White's primary villain, and he sometimes refers to the main view he opposes as Cartesian rationalism. White finds himself also opposed to many who are generally considered empiricists, such as Hume and the logical empiricists, whom he calls half-rationalists, since they construe logical and mathematical truth as independent of experience. White's clear and vigorous insistence on this point sharpens the distinction between pragmatism and empiricism. In his development of holistic pragmatism, White embraces the older tradition of James and Dewey, distancing himself from the scientism of Quine -- in spite of the holistic thrust of the second half of Quine's famous "Two Dogmas" paper -- as well as from the Vienna Circle.

White's chapter on James, focusing on his psychology and his philosophy of religion, provides a rich extension of pragmatism beyond the thinking of Quine. Perhaps reference to James's Principles of Psychology is only to be expected, James being on all accounts a central figure in American pragmatism. But White gives primary attention to Varieties of Religious Experience, published at the beginning of the century, and treats the later lectures on Pragmatism with considerable reservation. White has two main aims in his exegesis of James. One is to defend James's respect for religious experience and to incorporate such experience into the flux of experience into which we try to work a manageable structure. This moves him decisively away from the scientism associated with other varieties of pragmatism. The other is to attribute to James a methodological monism and thereby avoid saddling him with dichotomies or radical distinctions of the kind that would contradict pragmatism as White understands it. He has an uphill fight on both issues, as readers of James will be aware, and he acknowledges the challenges that certain well-known texts present. He admittedly chooses to stress certain texts and downplay others, so as to emerge with a defensible picture of James's thought. Such a procedure contrasts with common academic procedures, including the harsh and almost disdainful commentaries of Russell and Moore, who construe James in such a way as to make his views indefensible. But White's procedure is not merely gentle, it is also consistent with his holistic pragmatism. For he treats James's texts just as he says we all treat the flux we encounter, by trying to work the most manageable structure into it.

Picking and choosing among texts so as to emerge with the most manageable structure will not appeal to those who look instead first and foremost for clarity and consistency. It is useful to think of White's method here as a mark of the distinction between pragmatic and analytic exegesis. White employs such exegesis through his consideration of the philosophers he embraces, from Edwards through Quine, but readers will find him harsher in his consideration of those he considers rationalist or half-rationalist, most of whom are European rather than American.

In his chapter on Dewey White naturally endorses Dewey's conception of logic and the theory of inquiry, rather than a discipline of a priori truth, and also his Theory of Valuation, which treats moral judgment as engaging in what White presents to us as holistic pragmatic inquiry. But the title of the chapter is "Dewey's Philosophy of Art," and it therefore marks not only White's nestling into the tradition of American pragmatism but also his first effort of reading that tradition so that it embraces aesthetics as well as science, a theme he pursues from a different angle in his later chapter on Goodman.

Following the chapter on Dewey are discussions of the dualisms White rejects in earlier pragmatism, of logical empiricism (especially Carnap), of historical explanation, of Goodman's integration of philosophy of language and philosophy of art, of Oliver Wendell Holmes as the pragmatic exponent par excellence of philosophy of law, and of ethics and Rawls's Theory of Justice. In each of these chapters there is an original approach to familiar material, and White is consistent in extending the range of the holistic pragmatism he has set out as his philosophy of culture.

The longest chapters in the book are those on history and law. In his discussion of philosophy of history White begins by distinguishing history from narrative, on the basis of causal explanations being offered by historians but omitted by narrators. He embraces the well-known view that historical explanation depends on general laws just as much as scientific explanation does. He explicitly rejects the contrary view of R. G. Collingwood, that historians depend on insight into individual persons and institutions. For White a cause in history will be either a state or event, selected for emphasis by the historian, that is related to the outcome to be explained by means of a general law. As to the laws, they may pertain to individuals or particular institutions as well as to type of states or events. As to the selection by the historian of what is to be emphasized, that will depend on the interests of the historian. The laws are either valid or not, independent of interests. But historians may differ about the cause of an event, even though they acknowledge the same laws, because their interests differ and they therefore emphasize different factors. It is troubling that such disagreements seem not amenable to reasonable resolution, but it perhaps accurately describes the field of history to conclude that they are not.

My own reservation about this conception of historical explanation is that it understates the degree to which historical explanations assign or remove blame. Explanations of the Civil War, for example, fall into roughly three categories, sometimes blaming separatists in the South, sometimes abolitionists in the North, and sometimes exonerating both by finding the cause in underlying factors. White ignores this moral dimension of historical explanation, as do many historians.

White's discussion of law is a refreshing and extended exegesis of the writings of Justice Oliver Wendell Holmes. While it is regrettable that we find no comments on other American jurists, we can see that White is here exercising what he has previously defended as the historians' prerogative of focusing where their interests lie. Holmes, notoriously, claimed that the law is what judges say it is. Therefore a good attorney is one who successfully predicts what judges will say. It is this point that White wants to incorporate into his philosophy of culture and to defend against its obvious vulnerabilities. His exegesis and defense has two main parts, first to refute H. L. A. Hart's contrary arguments and then to distinguish between the lawyer's perspective and the judge's perspective of saying what the law is.

Hart falls into a by-now familiar category, world-renowned British critics of American pragmatism, the previously encountered ones being Russell, Moore, and Collingwood. The persistence of this opposition reinforces the impression that holistic pragmatism is a very American philosophy of culture.

White's own criticism of Holmes is that he failed to distinguish between what a lawyer says to a client that the law is and what a judge from the bench says that the law is. In the first case the adage of Holmes works, and the pronouncement of the lawyer to the client is a prediction. The better the lawyer, the better the predictions about what judges will say. And predictions fit easily into holistic pragmatism. But speaking from the bench the judge issues a decree rather than a prediction. Here a sharp distinction is necessary, but it is a distinction White welcomes, unlike that between analytic and synthetic truths, because it is not a dichotomy between two sorts of truth but a difference between two uses of language. In the language of J. L. Austin we might say that the lawyer's utterance is "constative" and the judge's is "performative"; but White makes no reference to Austin, nor to his American follower John Searle. Nor does he at this point refer to Wittgenstein's elaboration of a multitude of uses of language, though he earlier (62-63) mentions features of Wittgenstein's work that bring him close to James (without mentioning the work of Russell Goodman, which shows the relation to be much closer than White imagines), and suggests cautiously that Wittgenstein's insistence that we need to pay attention to how people behave might make his work congenial to holistic pragmatism. In spite of his shying away from relevant work done in Britain, White's distinction between predictions and decrees serves well to restore Holmes to a more favorable light.

The matter in Wittgenstein over which White hesitates is whether he is committed to a dichotomy between two kinds of truth. Wittgenstein indeed insists on a sharp distinction between grammatical and experiential propositions, and this distinction is indeed a descendant of Kant's distinction between analytic and synthetic judgments, even though Wittgenstein does not directly comment on this passage in Kant. It is clear that a grammatical proposition is not a truth-claim but an alternative use of language. That is not clear in the case of Kant, and most commentators have read Kant as asserting the contrary. White's conception of "the most manageable structure" for incorporating these texts is one that counts Kant as an implacable enemy. So he pays no attention to the controversy over Kant's distinction, nor to Kant's last explanation of it as the difference between "ampliative" and "explicative" propositions. If White were inclined to read Kant as generously as he reads James and Holmes, he might well conclude that an explicative judgment is a bit of grammar rather than a truth-claim, and hence a different language-game. But White's interest in the history of philosophy focuses on redeeming Americans rather than Europeans.

T. S. Eliot writes in one of his later poems, "We had the experience but missed its meaning." I wonder if that can make sense in White's pragmatic perspective. Eliot achieves a powerful poignant impact by presupposing a dichotomy, it seems, between an experience and its meaning. White's holistic pragmatism not only eschews dichotomies but also embraces a vigorous and active individualism. This active dimension means that each of us, when something happens, must work to accommodate that happening within our evolving framework of beliefs and values for confronting the world and responding to it. This work of accommodation can be very challenging, and it is a powerful feature of White's view that no aspect of our beliefs, our methodology, our logic, or our values is in principle immune from revision in the course of such work. The question that arises when we consider Eliot's remark is when and how this work begins.

A happening is not the same as an experience, for the happening may not be noticed even unconsciously. When I notice something happen, what I notice is its clash or congruence with my system of beliefs and values, and it is just that clash or congruence that makes the happening an experience and gives it its meaning. This simple way of construing an experience and its meaning leaves no room for appreciating Eliot. To have an experience is to see the meaning of what has happened. The idea of an experience without meaning is incoherent, given the most attractive aspects of White's philosophy of culture.

A holistic pragmatist might reply that to err is human, and that we can appreciate Eliot by acknowledging that his initial experience involved a superficial conception of its meaning, and that what Eliot refers to as its meaning is the accommodation we later adopt when we come to reject our first one. A good reply. But is it consistent with holistic pragmatism? Does it not depend on distinguishing fact and value, between having an experience and seeing its meaning? How one responds to this question will determine, in large part, one's level of comfort with White's philosophy of culture, and with its distinctively American worldview.

A philosophy of culture is not an easy sell, and few readers will accept all of White's arguments and contentions. But every part of the volume is stimulating and worth reading, and most readers are bound to come away impressed with White's erudition, his breadth of view, his persistence, and his commitment.