A Political Theory of Territory

Placeholder book cover

Margaret Moore, A Political Theory of Territory, Oxford University Press, 2015, 263 pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190222246. 

Reviewed by Tamar Meisels, Tel-Aviv University


What exactly is the appropriate relationship between people and territory? This is the fundamental question that Margaret Moore sets out to answer in her new book, offering the reader A Political Theory of Territory. No set of moral questions appears more pressing today than the series of issues she addresses in it: Who has the right to what territory, and what should such territorial rights include? No other philosophical volume thus far has supplied an answer as complete and all-encompassing as the account of territorial justice delivered in this impressive book.


On April 1606, James I of England established by royal charter a joint-stock company, the London Company, for the purposes of establishing colonial settlement in North America and claiming land for the English crown to the exclusion of other European powers . . . Although the land was 'claimed' in the charter, there was an expectation that these claims needed to be consolidated with long term English settlement and military defense of the settlements. Under the auspices of the London Company, George Summers, an admiral of the company's Third Supply relief fleet, set sail from Plymouth, England, on 2 June 1609, destined for Jamestown Virginia, carrying 500-600 people, including crew and settlers. On 25 July, the fleet ran into a hurricane and one of the ships eventually ran aground on the rocks just off an uninhabited island, and the passengers and crew . . . were able to make it to the shores of what we now know as Bermuda. The crew and passengers set to work building a settlement there, including a church and some houses, and this original settlement is now thought to constitute the founding of Bermuda. (p. 1)

Why do we need a political theory of territory, and what should such a theory aspire to do? Clearly, we no longer accept royal charter and settlement as a legitimate basis for territorial acquisition and holding, branding it colonialism and imperialism. In many places (of which Bermuda is not one), we also lament the injustices that accompanied colonization at the wholesale expense of indigenous people. Nevertheless, our world remains divided into territorial states, partly founded on modern settlement projects, that typically resist any changes in their borders. What should we think about the right to territory, particularly where more than one group lays claim to a single piece of land or to the use of its resources? Territorial rights also raise a series of additional troubling questions when we consider that states assert the right to control the flow of people and goods across their borders, keeping strangers out and valuable natural resources within (p. 2; Chapter 9).

Unlike 17th century Bermuda, the entire usable landmass of our planet today is already divided into distinct, mutually exclusive, territorial units. Land has always been a valuable asset, but it is now an increasingly scarce commodity. (Mark Twain famously counseled: "buy land, they're not making it anymore"). Our world is rife with territorial conflict, secessionist claims, refugee crises, world poverty, and gross resource inequality, all lending themselves to bitter, often violent, international disputes. Further normatively problematic issues lie ahead "as states seek to extend their control to the area under the seabed, to the frozen Arctic, and perhaps eventually beyond the Earth" (p. 3).

Theory, however, has not kept up with practice: we still require a systematic, well worked out political theory of territory for approaching real-world cases of territorial strife coherently and consistently if we are to hold out any hope of resolving these issues justly. Moore successfully addresses this lacuna.

Over the past few decades, some philosophical attention has been focused on a variety of territorial issues. This literature, however, remains relatively sparse in comparison with the attention political philosophy has focused on issues of justice within states. Moreover, existing literature on territorial rights is often quite specific, typically focusing on a single aspect of territoriality, such as secession, immigration, boundary disputes, resource rights, historical injustices, and so forth. By contrast, Moore offers us a comprehensive and systematic account of territory from a philosophical perspective. To begin with, we need to know what a territory is; who are the relevant candidates for holding territorial rights; how much land they are entitled to, and what their rights consist of. Moore offers her readers a sophisticated and well-reasoned set of arguments in answer to all these crucial questions.


Consistent with her previous celebrated work on liberal nationalism, Moore's political theory justifies territorial rights in terms of the moral value of political self-determination. This right is ascribed to peoples, defined as groups with a distinct political (rather than cultural) identity. A territorial right, Moore tells us, is a right of jurisdiction held by a people (rather than a state or a cultural nation) based on its members' right to self-determination. More specifically, she distinguishes a 'people' from other social groups as a collective agent whose members share a (subjective) conception of themselves as a group, have the capacity to establish political institutions through which they can (and in fact aspire to) exercise their self-determination, and have a shared history of political cooperation together (p. 50). Moore then argues that a people is typically attached to a particular place and that as a group it has a legitimate fundamental interest in maintaining control over that place as a place of a certain kind with a certain character (Chapter 3).

In setting out a collective self-determination theory of territory in which territorial rights are ascribed to non-statist groups defined by their political (not cultural) identity, Moore adds a new and distinctive voice to the existing theoretical literature on territory. By attaching territorial rights to non-state groups, she separates her theory from those that associate territorial entitlement with the rights of existing states. Defining the relevant right holder as 'a people', rather than a nation, distinguishes her account from theorists who assign these rights only to cultural nations.

Chapters 4 and 5 subsequently defend the superiority of this political self-determination theory of territory over its two principal rivals: culturalist theories (David Miller, Tamar Meisels, and Avery Kolers) on the one side and functionalist-statist accounts of territory (e.g. Hobbes, Kant, Jeremy Waldron, Allen Buchanan, Anna Stilz, and Lea Ypi) on the other. Contra cultural accounts, most notably Miller's On Nationality,[1] Moore points out that at least some groups that we consider nations and potential territorial right holders do not seem to share a culture as that is normally understood. For example: "Canadians do not have a culture sharply distinct from Americans . . . Nevertheless, there is a quite distinct political identity in Canada, with distinct political aspirations" (p. 80). Arguably, however, a cultural-nationalist might respond by suggesting that "political identity" is in fact part of national culture.

Opposing functional-statist accounts, Chapter 5 identifies three flaws in regarding states as the beneficiaries of territorial rights: Purely functionalist accounts are unable to identify territorial right-holders prior to the establishment of their state, statist accounts exhibit status quo bias, and statist accounts are counter-intuitive in cases where they confer rights on a state that is effective but unjust (p. 107).


With an answer to 'who has the right to territory' in hand ('a people' is the appropriate right-holder), Moore turns to consider 'how much territory' a people might be entitled to. Chapter 6 looks at some timely issues concerning boundary disputes between neighboring states, secessionist claims, and the drawing, and redrawing, of borders. This discussion of boundary drawing is the first of the more applied philosophy chapters, closely followed by a particularly useful discussion of historical injustice (Chapter 7).

Demands for corrective justice in the territorial context raise various issues and questions: Does history matter? Should ancient injustices interest us today? Should we care who reached the territory first and who were its prior inhabitants? Moore helpfully responds by distinguishing and analyzing a variety of moral wrongs involved in territorial misappropriation, to wit: violating rights of residency, occupancy, self-determination, and/or property rights. She then argues persuasively that the appropriate remedy in each concrete case corresponds to the precise type of rights violation that occurred as well as with reference to the passage of time and the interests of present occupants. Addressing Waldron's "Superseding Historic Injustice"[2] throughout the chapter, Moore resists the idea that past injustices can be wholly superseded by circumstances. This, she argues, is "because rights violations are not harmful just to the interests of the victims but also represent a moral wrong, a kind of disrespect for their status as moral equals" (p. 158). Nonetheless, ultimately Moore effectively accepts the basic logic of Waldron's Supersession Thesis regarding the effects of changing circumstances on considerations of justice and its practical conclusion against massive reversion.

Next, Chapter 8 addresses resource rights and claims to uninhabited lands, suggesting plausibly that competing claims to unoccupied lands -- islands, oceans, the ocean bed air, and the earth underground -- ought to be viewed as property claims rather than territorial disputes. As for natural resources such as oil, coal, and water, this section of the book succeeds once again in staking out a new and very reasonable middle ground between existing views. Considering the strong resource rights conception associated with state sovereignty on the one hand and cosmopolitan approaches that attribute no special rights to groups over resources within their midst on the other, Moore argues for peoples' limited rights over the resources in their territory, consistent with her overall argument on self-determination. A limited right to resources would account for the special connection peoples often have with terrains and natural assets that fall within the territories they inhabit and on which they exercise their right to self-determination. At the same time, Moore argues, these rights, commonly associated with state sovereignty, ought not to be viewed as absolute. The distinct limits she suggests in this chapter reflect concerns about global unfairness in the natural distribution of resources and the general right to subsistence of everyone.

Chapter 9 considers the vexed and contentious issue of immigration, excluding potential migrants, and the right to control the flow of goods, as well as people, across borders. Moore accurately identifies and classifies the right to control borders and immigration as a territorial right, deriving from a peoples' right to self-determination. Not unlike the previous chapter and in keeping with her general thesis on self-determination, Moore defends a limited right to exclude and turn away migrants, carving out a persuasive middle ground between current state practice and advocates of open borders.

Individuals within political communities, Moore maintains throughout, are connected and attached to specific places and have a right to self-determination in those places, understood as a jurisdictional right to shape and retain the particular character of their political community within the territories they inhabit. Open borders and the resultant influx of migrants from poor countries would not enable people and peoples to exercise this right and would threaten the specific character of the place they inhabit and to which they are collectively attached. Notwithstanding interests in self-determination, however, the right to control borders and exclude potential migrants, just like the right to natural resources, must be pursued in ways consistent with human rights. Consequently, the rights of exclusion Moore defends fall short of the full and robust rights over borders currently asserted by states. In particular, human rights and distributive justice considerations indicate that "richer political communities have obligations to ensure that the basic entitlements of people to live a decent life are met" (p. 215). The exclusion of needy migrants can be justified, Moore argues, only if and where obligations towards the global poor are met by means other than open borders (e.g. by guaranteeing fair trade, granting resource assistance, international aid, etc.).

The final chapter interestingly ties the issue of territorial entitlement to the vast literature and scholarship on just war theory and considers the conditions under which a people (rather than a state) may legitimately resort to armed force in defense of its territorial integrity and/or in pursuit of their right to self-determination. This connection between territorial justice and the voluminous academic literature on just war theory appears natural, even essential. Nonetheless, this is the first volume I have seen that deliberates on both issues in unison, considering just cause and ad bellum proportionality with reference to territorial rights. This linkage is in itself a valuable contribution to existing scholarship in both fields.

As for its content and conclusions, this final chapter remains in keeping with the overall thesis of the book, concluding coherently and consistently that the people (which may or may not be co-extensive with a state) may legitimately defend its right to territorially based self-determination as a political community, subject to necessity and proportionality. Needless to say, this view on just war deviates significantly from international law and customs of war, which traditionally attribute the right to wage war in defense of territorial integrity to states.


Over a decade ago I wrote a book on Territorial Rights based on my Oxford D. Phil thesis supervised by David Miller.[3] As a student of Miller, I was greatly influenced by his work On Nationality, but I also learned a great deal from Moore's early writing on National Self -Determination and Secession and later from The Ethics of Nationalism.[4] In the book and articles that resulted from my thesis, I pointed out that liberal nationalism had not focused sufficient attention on the pertinent territorial aspect of nationality. Notwithstanding this observation, already by the late 1990's Moore's work presented an exception to this deficiency, and I addressed it extensively in my own writing. Coming from Israel, I naturally had the Arab-Israeli conflict closely in mind. I tried to offer some initial thoughts and guidelines for adjudicating territorial disputes in contested areas from a liberal-nationalist perspective. I did not, however, remedy all the shortcomings I complained of in existing (and largely non-existent) philosophical debates on territorial disputes.

A number of other authors, before and since, have done a better job than I did in addressing various aspects of the territorial issue, most notably Miller, Waldron, Chaim Gans, Buchanan, and later Stilz, Kolers, Cara Nine, and Ypi. All are included in discussion throughout Moore's new book. Above and beyond the originality of its arguments, Moore's book impressively surveys and critiques all the relevant philosophical literature on territory, presenting its reader with a clear overview of pre-existing accounts, as well as distinguishing its own contribution from those that pre-date it. No other author to date has taken on the wide array of issues discussed in Moore's current work, nor has anyone previously addressed the entire range of interlocutors in the territorial debate. Moore delivers on her promise, presenting us with a systematic book length theory of territory, unmatched by any of the previous writing on this topic. She has given those of us interested in territorial justice a book which deserves much praise. For anyone working on issues related to territory, this book is a veritable 'must read'.

[1] David Miller, On Nationality, (Oxford University Press, 1995).

[2] Jeremy Waldron, 'Superseding Historic Injustice', Ethics 103 (October 1992), 4-28.

[3] Tamar Meisels, Territorial Rights (Springer Academic Publishers, Law and Philosophy Series (December 2005, 2009).

[4] Margaret Moore (ed.) National Self-Determination and Secession (Oxford University Press, 1998). Margaret Moore, The Ethics of Nationalism, (Oxford University Press, 2001).