A Pragmatist Philosophy of Democracy

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Robert B. Talisse, A Pragmatist Philosophy of Democracy, Routledge, 2007, 166pp., $135.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415770880.

Reviewed by David Hildebrand, University of Colorado Denver


Each year, solutions to the problem "How can we all get along?" prove more vexing and remote. Are we stymied by cultural or economic differences? Is deliberation impoverished by the double-whammy of consumerism and its conduit, a 24/7, entertainment-oriented media system? In A Pragmatist Philosophy of Democracy (PPD) Robert B. Talisse rules out none of these factors while pushing a boldly original democratic theory appealing not only to pragmatists but to anyone who cares more about solving real problems than protecting philosophical turf. With clarity and force, Talisse's immensely readable book briskly acquaints readers with the complex theories necessary to grappling with issues worth caring about. While meticulously attentive to pertinent scholarship, Talisse is never pedantic or jargonistic. He educates the reader by reiterating exactly the premises necessary to move his theses ahead. By the end, the reader feels a real stake in the questions and answers posed; I cannot recommend PPD highly enough.

I give a short synopsis of Talisse's book before offering extended commentary about what I consider its underlying (and motivating) philosophical theses. I conclude by briefly praising places where the text held special interest.

PPD comprises an epilogue, preface, and six main chapters. Preface and epilogue offer Talisse's motivations. These frame the book and Talisse uses them to explicate the "pragmatist roots and motivations" (vii) of democracy he first offered in his recent Democracy After Liberalism.[1] He also intends to expose (and shame) contemporary pragmatists who, Talisse claims, promulgate "conspiracy stories" about an "eclipse" of classical pragmatism (CP). Such stories are pernicious for cultivating "attitudes, habits, and scholarly practices" that foster "resentment" and "a regrettable and ultimately self-defeating intellectual insularity." (134) Chapter 1, "Pragmatism's Ambiguous Legacy," provides an acerbic potted history of how contemporary CPs have positioned themselves as "inheritors and stewards" of this tradition -- typically by contesting Richard Rorty's excesses or lamenting analytic philosophy's impoverished ambitions. Pace these pragmatists, however, Talisse claims, there is no such unified thing as CP, and he justifies this by pointing to deep differences between Charles S. Peirce, William James, and John Dewey. (Of particular portent here is Talisse's sense in Peirce of a distinctly "minimalist" view of inquiry; this interpretation provides the ground for his development, later, of a new pragmatist democracy.) "Can Democracy be a Way of Life?" (Chapter 2) elaborates on how Dewey and Peirce were significantly different, arguing that Deweyan democracy constitutes what John Rawls called a "comprehensive doctrine." Because any such doctrine must exclude other comprehensive (but nevertheless reasonable) views, Dewey's democracy proves self-refuting: since it is oppressive to pluralism it fatally contradicts Dewey's core democratic values. Chapter 3, "Peirce, Inquiry, and Politics," and chapter 4, "Pluralism and the Peircean View," ground an alternative pragmatist approach found in Peirce's two famous pragmatist papers.[2] Those works, Talisse claims, show how Peirce's advocacy for the "method of science" already reveals his epistemic preference for certain basic political arrangements; they also provide an account of inquiry "thin" enough to both serve democratic theory and still be unobjectionable to all rational comers. This theory would be more than just procedural because it does promote a way of life; but its substance would be "thin" because its prescriptions align with what is already immanent in our best practices. Thus, this Peircean view avoids the problems with pluralism which doom Dewey. With the central argument made, chapter 5, "Posner's Pragmatic Realism," further ratifies the Peircean view by demonstrating its superiority to another contemporary pragmatist view by Richard Posner. Finally, chapter 6, "The Case of Sidney Hook," presents Talisse's interpretation of Hook's theory and practice. By highlighting Hook's under-appreciated Peircean affinities, Talisse aims to show why Hook deserves greater consideration as a first-rate philosopher of democracy.

As I read PPD, I kept returning to two fundamental propellants powering Talisse's argument for a Peircean-based democratic theory. The first is constructive: his quest for a lean, non-normative pragmatist inquiry to provide just enough of a philosophical basis for a broadly effective conception of democracy. The second is destructive: the argument that political theorists should reject Dewey's self-refuting philosophy of democracy. Taken together, the insight is this: get over Dewey and accept this particular Peirce and we get just what we need from pragmatism for the purposes of democracy. I will now assess each of these in turn.

Propellant 1: The Ambiguous Legacy of Pragmatism and the Peircean Alternative

PPD's argument depends on first seeing Peirce in a new light so that what is valuable can be taken out of its originary context for use by contemporary political theory. While some may debate whether interpretation and use of Peirce can be separated, Talisse makes it clear that his goal is not to engage in scholastic disputes about pragmatism. The conditions for this are arranged by Talisse's critique in chapter 1 of what he considers the standard claptrap of some contemporary pragmatists. Such claptrap includes (a) the unity which supposedly binds CPs together, falsely lumping Peirce's pragmatism with those of Dewey and James (this myth has obscured fruitful uses of Peircean inquiry for democratic theory); and (b) an erroneous chronicling of how CP was "eclipsed" in the 20th century by the nefarious forces of analytic philosophy. Talisse laments that prominent Americanists (the "stewards," "inheritors," and "gate-keepers" of CP) have used the "unity narrative" to afford themselves attitudes of persecution and righteous entitlement; the result has been, he argues, unhelpful insularity and shoddy scholarship.[3] Talisse's rebuke, then, of the unity and eclipse narratives aims to wrest hermeneutic control away from these Americanists so that the possibilities inherent in pragmatism may be more available for democratic theory. Because the thrust of PPD is not intellectual history, Talisse can only gesture at how these various assumptions are wrong. I suspect readers will either be delighted, enraged, or nonplussed by Talisse's prickly arguments based on their own experience and assumptions.[4] Rather than engage these topics, let us move quickly to an issue central to the pragmatist legacy, namely Peirce's reaction to James and the degree to which Peirce's own method can be viably thought of as non-normative.

According to Talisse, pragmatism began to devolve when James psychologized Peirce's pragmatic maxim. Peirce formulated the pragmatic maxim to assess propositional meaning using observable measures -- that is all that should be included in its practical and objective purport. James expounded Peirce's maxim to include the personal and subjective consequences of believing a proposition.[5] Despite James' claim that pragmatism was a "corridor philosophy," and thus neutral to different results, this was in fact an attempt to settle disputes by imposing the beliefs and values of pragmatism itself.[6] As will become clear in Talisse's argument against Dewey, James' prescriptivist inflation is the signal error in pragmatism's development -- at least so far as applicability to democracy is concerned. Jamesian pragmatism, in effect, helped normalize the idea that pragmatism actually endorsed philosophical claims and accepted specific solutions for standard metaphysical problems. James and Dewey thus deviated from Peirce, whose pragmatism never crossed such normative lines.[7]

Rather than contest Talisse's interpretation of James, let me indicate several key claims about Peirce which readers might want to question. First, there is the proposal that Peirce thought pragmatism could and should be "neutral" (i.e., it could/should "clarify" meanings from a non-normative standpoint). These are philosophical and meta-philosophical claims, respectively. The second proposal is that Peirce's view of reason and inquiry was epistemologically uncontroversial because it was immanent -- already implied by common inquirential practices. The third is that Peirce's minimalistic pragmatism can be considered apart from his other substantive and systematic philosophical writings. All three interpretations of Peirce's philosophy are important to Talisse because they render Peirce's pragmatism "minimal" and thus tolerant of those with differing normative commitments.

I leave the third issue aside, as it requires detailed analysis by Peirce scholars and because Talisse's thesis does not rely heavily upon it. The first issue (pragmatism's neutrality) is thorny, not least because of Peirce's denigration of Cartesianism’s "paper doubt". In "Some Consequences of Four Incapacities" Peirce wrote,

We cannot begin with complete doubt. We must begin with all the prejudices which we actually have when we enter upon the study of philosophy… . A person may … in the course of his studies, find reason to doubt what he began by believing; but in that case he doubts because he has a positive reason for it, and not on account of the Cartesian maxim. Let us not pretend to doubt in philosophy what we do not doubt in our hearts. (CP 5.265, my emphasis)[8]

It is absurd, Peirce thought, for philosophers formulating propositions and hypotheses to attempt a logical standpoint from some abstract "nowhere." In this regard, Peirce stands shoulder to shoulder with other major pragmatists against a long-dominant posture in philosophy; none believed that a "God's-eye view" made sense. The standpoint of pragmatism was one of radical, empirical observation and experiment -- leading to the formation of habits that are, by their very nature, teleological (because they originate from future-oriented interests and goals).[9] At the same time, as Talisse rightly points out, Peirce could not accept the too-personal, too subjectivistic starting point he saw James suggesting. For us, the question becomes what kinds of logical starting points lie between these two extremes (the a-personal and the too-personal)? Further, which can be considered normatively "neutral" or, to stay with Rawlsian language, "minimal"?

Dewey has an answer to this question, and Talisse takes it on directly; for the moment, let us stay with Peirce. It is true that Peirce said "Pragmatism solves no real problem. It only shows that the supposed problems are not real problems." (Peirce CP 8.25; Talisse, PPD 10). Still how should we square this almost magisterial pretension to objectivity ("real problems") with the earlier warning of Peirce's to begin "with all the prejudices which we actually have when we enter upon the study of philosophy"? If philosophical inquirers must start where they are, then would they not have to begin with the prejudices they hold as full human beings -- that is, with the goals and values which brought them right up to the point of this latest inquiry? How can the starting point of every epistemic inquiry avoid being founded, normatively?

The Talissean-Peircean reply to this objection runs through many sections of the book and, to my mind, is a deeply interesting one. The reply goes something like this: of course we start with prejudices -- normative commitments are part of being a human inquirer. But reason allows us to critically examine, even divest, ourselves from prejudicial assumptions; we need not end with prejudices.[10] Indeed, successful resolution of moral conflicts depends on whether we can be guided by logical methods already implicit in human expectations about what proper inquiry is. This is why sensible people balk at the blind affirmation of customary or cultural values.[11] Assuring that logic guides us (in a correct way) comprises the central, indispensable epistemic function of a Peircean democratic community.

I lack space to further discuss this deep and central issue.[12] I would note, though, that for readers to accept this interpretation of Peirce (for, admittedly, purposes beyond pragmatism), they must accept Talisse's claim that Peirce's characterizations of inquiry, knowledge, and truth are not "positive philosophical commitments" but mere explications of how humans already operate.[13] In other words, they must accept that Peirce has merely grasped something factual (implied by human epistemic practices) and has just reported it. Unlike the pluralism that makes moral life so complicated, they must accept Talisse's claim that "there is no corresponding pluralism with regard to our most basic epistemic commitments." (55)[14] In contrast, pragmatists like Dewey and James, Talisse argues, move beyond minimal description and wind up, in essence, preaching.[15] Unlike Peirce, their conflation of normative and epistemic values predispose them to fail the test of Rawlsian pluralism as just two more substantive views.

Finally, if one accepts that Peirce has accomplished the above -- enunciated epistemic practices without any normative backdrop -- one must be prepared to accept the Talissean-Peircean claim that it is "simple" for inquirers to "specify the observable effects that would follow were a proposition true." Phenomenologically, this presents a problem, for given the manifold richness of any experienced situation, the task of specifying what is observable is anything but simple. Indeed, it seems impossibly daunting if done neutrally -- i.e. without a rather robust normative starting point. But such a starting point is precisely what Talisse's Peirce must disallow.

Propellant 2: The Brief Against Dewey

The second major "propellant" driving PPD is Talisse's brief against John Dewey. Of the pragmatists, Dewey most influenced democratic theory, so this critique is a necessary preliminary to clearing the way for Peirce. Talisse's chapter 2 forcefully confronts Dewey and Deweyans with the Rawlsian test of "reasonable pluralism." None pass. As Talisse explains it,

Pluralism is the thesis that at least some, and perhaps many, disagreements over Big Questions [questions regarding ultimate ends, the good life, and philosophical, theological, and moral basics] are inevitable, irresolvable, non-contingent, and permanent … even among sincere, well-intentioned, and rational persons attending carefully to the relevant considerations and doing their epistemic best to reach reasoned agreement … (34)

Evidence for this thesis, Talisse argues, is prima facie and abundant: in daily interactions and throughout the media one encounters a variety of moral and political views that, while reasonable, cannot be reconciled. Deweyan democracy's problem is that it cannot accommodate this fact.

The aim of Deweyan democracy is to reconstruct society according to Dewey's particular social vision despite the reasonable objections of such persons. Therefore the project of reconstructing all of society in the image of Dewey's particular comprehensive doctrine is oppressive, since it unavoidably involves the coercion of reasonable persons to live within civic and political institutions and structures that are organized around a comprehensive moral vision of human flourishing that they could reasonably reject. (46)

Talisse makes several points to support his thesis. First, Dewey's theory of democratic inquiry emerges from his view of "experience". This is a metaphysical notion for Dewey, and so is contestable, not "thin."[16] Whether Dewey gets experience right is besides the point; if his epistemic view of inquiry is at all tied to a metaphysics it can be reasonably challenged by others with different substantive metaphysical views. Peirce, we recall, does not weigh down his theory of inquiry the way Dewey does; he simply reported how inquiry happens. His doubt-belief model (central in the 1877-78 articles) is "wholly detachable" from his larger, systemic philosophy. Thus, Talisse says, Peircean inquiry does not presume contestable metaphysical answers.

Another reason Talisse thinks Dewey fails the pluralism test is that Dewey's view that democracy was a "way of life" was too comprehensive and specific. Dewey

prescribes not only a collection of dispositions and attitudes that citizens should embody, but also … a model of institutional design that is intended to extend to 'all the areas and ways of living,' and to govern 'all modes of human association,' including 'the family, the school, industry, religion.' (LW11:25, LW2:325, PPD 43)[17]

Thus, Dewey's democracy "involves the social prescription that all social and political institutions should be designed … to help realize that particular vision of the moral life." (44-45) Such a vision, Talisse concludes, is oppressive because it effectively "seeks to coerce people to live under political institutions that are explicitly designed to cultivate norms and realize civic ideals that they could reasonably reject." (45)

I wish to first comment on metaphysical assumptions. Insofar as Dewey has a metaphysics (a question that itself has generated energetic debate), that metaphysics is at least claimed to be the result of an empirical process, proposed hypothetically, and aimed at the amelioration of social problems. Dewey does, as Talisse says, build "into his conception of inquiry a Darwinian conception of experience as the experimental activity of an organism within an environment" (18); however, this is not a traditional, speculative assumption but a defeasible, empirical generalization. Given the long history of complications traceable back to liberalism's traditional assumption of the atomic individual, one can appreciate why Dewey needed to provide a broader account of inquiry's experiential context than Peirce gave in the 1877-78 papers.[18] Notably, though, Peirce does employ language consonant with evolutionary biology ("irritation," "reflex action," and "struggle") As a result, Talisse's argument seems to rest on whether or not Peirce's concept of inquiry is autonomous enough to shift vocabularies -- from naturalist ones toward others unburdened by such metaphysical presumptions. Regardless, I am untroubled by Dewey's "philosophical commitments" because insofar as they provide a back-story for his theory of inquiry, they are (a) appurtenant to understanding that theory, and (b) arrived at empirically and proffered fallibilistically.

I wish now to comment on the second, more important objection to Dewey regarding "democracy as a way of life." Recall that Talisse finds this "fundamentally misguided and ultimately incoherent when taken as a social ideal for contemporary democratic societies" because as a vision it is so substantive that it will be coercive or oppressive of plural groups with other forms of life. While Talisse may be understandably puzzled at how Dewey's democratic vision of a democratic life translates into specific democratic practices, I cannot see in Dewey's ideas the absolute and suffocating prescriptivism to which Talisse objects. In fact, as I searched through Dewey's political writings, I found Dewey repeatedly celebrating America's plural character while insisting that democracy support and affirm those diversities as it educated individuals to communicate across them. For example, in "The Need of an Industrial Education in an Industrial Democracy" he writes that

In a complex society, ability to understand and sympathize with the operations and lot of others is a condition of common purpose which only education can procure. The external differences of pursuit and experience are so very great in our complicated industrial civilization, that men will not see across and through the walls which separate them, unless they have been trained to do so. (MW10:139)

The idea of democracy, Dewey continues, must be continually debated precisely to guard against the one-size-fits-all ideal which disturbs Talisse.

[A suitably self-aware ideal of democracy] will recognize that its one great enemy is the hankering of men for unity of existence, aim and law in whatever form it may offer itself. It will recognize the infinite variety of human nature, and the infinite plurality of purposes for which men associate themselves together. It will recognize that progress is never in one line, but comes when a variety of things move along together. (MW10:139, my emphasis)

Dewey's discussion of the community is similarly nuanced, and argues that democracy is founded on the appreciation of diverse communal forms, not on a plan to impose a single set of prescriptions meant to "reconstruct" community as one thing.[19] Though Talisse argues Dewey's theory is unintentionally coercive (because substantive in Rawl's sense), it should at least be noted that Dewey wrote explicitly about why democracy should abhor coercion of even the subtlest kind.[20]

To evaluate the persuasiveness of Talisse's comparison of Dewey and Peirce -- that Peirce provides a more powerful model of epistemic practice for democracy than Dewey -- it is worth considering that there are multiple places where Dewey argues for precisely the kind of epistemic freedom for which Talisse celebrates Peirce.[21] The role of philosophy, as Dewey understood it, was not to coerce people's goals and values -- to prescribe the good for them -- but to help "clarify, liberate and extend the goods which inhere in the naturally generated functions of experience" by accepting and utilizing "the best available knowledge of its own time and place." (LW1:305) As he saw it, philosophy "has no Mosaic nor Pauline authority of revelation entrusted to it," rather "it accepts the goods that are diffused in human experience." (LW1:305)

In sum, Talisse raises serious questions about Dewey's suitability as a theorist of democracy which must be considered and answered. As I read him, Dewey is not a threat to pluralism because his proposal, pace Talisse, was not trying to prescribe algorithms for resolving, in advance, every possible social conflict. Moreover, his earnest proposals for educational and institutional change aimed not towards the promulgation of a specific "Deweyan way of life," but toward methods of inquiry which encouraged diverse publics to approach problems with a "habit of amicable cooperation." (LW14:228, my emphasis) Habits, to be sure, need not be overt prescriptions of particular normative values. Inculcating such habits might someday contribute to sympathetic bonds between antagonists so, at least, they perhaps could pursue the "procedural consensus" which Rawls was resigned to as the best we could get.

I have primarily made arguments central to Talisse's thesis. But there is a vast and fertile expanse of ideas in PPD to which I'd like to pay brief attention. Talisse's account of pluralism differentiates between the various senses of the term and connects them back to the practical and theoretical problems germane to our present-day debates over how to govern. He explicates and justifies the Rawlsian "fact of reasonable pluralism" to set up a powerful test for any democratic theory, not just pragmatist ones. His challenge to Posner's elitist rebuke of deliberativist democracy can no less be ignored. Because, Talisse argues, "our public culture of political discourse is already epistemic and deliberative in roughly the way the Peircean view envisions" (105) Posner's assumption of a largely disaffected and disinterested citizenry proves false. We care about evidence, truth, spin, propaganda, and lies. Since Posner's realist model "renders nonsensical the common democratic practice of political discussion, debate, and deliberation" it "fails to account for the fact of reasonable pluralism." (111) Posner's recent pragmatist suggestions are, then, untenable, and present yet another entrée for the Peircean approach. Finally, near PPD's end, Talisse presents a compelling case for why Sidney Hook represents what is best about pragmatist theory. Hook resisted prescribing specifically how we ought to live, and instead emphasized the epistemic processes of collective decision making and intelligent public discourse. This balance, Talisse argues, is exactly right: "Hook's life stands as an inspiring image of democratic success; for success consists precisely in the activity of political engagement by means of public inquiry." (124)


PPD is inspired by the conviction that the most substantive human differences -- over morality, religion, metaphysics, etc. -- must not be allowed to inform the creation of democratic theory because such influences can only produce intolerance and oppression. The proper approach is to admit elements which are substantive only in an epistemic sense. If one interprets Peirce's pragmatism correctly, it can be seen that these elements are already immanent in the best instances of human reasoning. Peirce, therefore, can provide an epistemological basis for democratic theory that respects the fact of reasonable pluralism in a way that other pragmatists (e.g. Rorty, Dewey, Posner) do not. Once the Peircean insight is understood, it becomes possible to borrow selectively from Sidney Hook to further advance an effective theory.

As I have argued, acceptance of PPD's proposal is contingent on a number of deeper claims: that the fact of reasonable pluralism poses the deep obstacle Talisse suggests; that it is possible to give an account of pragmatic, practical inquiry that segregates the epistemic from the normative; that a relatively small number of Peirce's articles can supply the basis for a full-fledged theory (and, indeed, that Peirce's pragmatist theory can be isolated from his other writings). Finally, one must accept Talisse's characterization of Dewey's democratic theory as substantive (in ways which are specific, prescriptive, and coercive). I am not convinced that Talisse succeeds in making all these deeper claims, but because he has pressed his case with admirable clarity and verve, readers will profit by judging his success for themselves.

[1] Democracy After Liberalism (NY: Routledge, 2005).

[2] I refer, of course, to "Fixation of Belief" and "How to Make Our Ideas Clear" in the 1877-78 Popular Science Monthly article series.

[3] These Americanist gate-keepers are, thus, "persistently urging the unflagging relevance and insight of the original pragmatist thinkers, while attempting also to monitor and control their intellectual legacies." (2)

[4] My own experiences with the American philosophic community has not shown me the kind of insularity or monomania that Talisse finds so obvious. This, in itself, proves nothing -- I may be monomaniacal (or complicit) and not know it. So, rather than respond to Talisse's psychological analysis with a counter-analysis, my pragmatic suggestion for those accused is to experimentally accept the onus of these accusations and act as if everything claimed here is true. What arguments need to be marshaled in response? What Americanist assumptions prove, under strain, to be unsupportable? Is there an alternate view of philosophy that is somehow better?

[5] Thus, for Peirce, "transubstantiation" is meaningless because there are no observable consequences to its truth or falsity; for James, a belief in transubstantiation can have profound effects on the attitude of the believer.

[6] "Thus," Talisse writes, "whereas for Peirce pragmatism was simply a logical rule for doing philosophy, for James, pragmatism was itself a philosophy." (9)

[7] "By contrast," Talisse writes, "Peirce rejects the idea that pragmatism itself entails any positive philosophical commitments beyond the pragmatic maxim and its corresponding criterion of meaninglessness. Since … the pragmatic maxim calls us simply to specify the observable effects that would follow were a proposition true, pragmatism does not settle any disputes; rather, it clarifies what is at issue in any given dispute, thereby helping us to identify what experiment or action to undertake in order to resolve it." (10)

[8] From the Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, volumes 1-6 edited by C. Hartshorne and P. Weiss, 1931-1935, volumes 7 and 8 edited by A.W. Burks, 1958 (Cambridge, Mass: Belknap Press). Abbreviated as CP followed by volume and page number.

[9] Thanks to Todd Lekan for reminding me of this basic point about habits. Thanks also to Colin Koopman for thoughtful discussion on the topics raised by PPD.

[10] Dewey frames the process of detaching oneself from prejudicial assumptions this way: "An empirical philosophy is in any case a kind of intellectual disrobing. We cannot permanently divest ourselves of the intellectual habits we take on and wear when we assimilate the culture of our own time and place. But intelligent furthering of culture demands that we take some of them off, that we inspect them critically to see what they are made of and what wearing them does to us. We cannot achieve recovery of primitive naïveté. But there is attainable a cultivated naïveté of eye, ear and thought." (LW1:40)

[11] "Peirce," Talisse writes, "is not so much prescribing for us a new way of inquiring as he is making explicit the commitments we already acknowledge as constitutive of proper inquiry." (13)

[12] Extensive discussion of this and other issues raised by Talisse's book are the subject of a forthcoming issue of the Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society (2009).

[13] Talisse writes "the Peircean conception of democracy is not committed to any metaethical view in particular; rather, it is committed to the uncontroversial claim that moral questions -- including questions of metaethics -- should be addressed by means of reasons, arguments, and evidence." (86) Thus, even tyrants follow this procedure when they are reasoning "scientifically" (in Peirce's sense). Insofar as a tyrant (or anyone else) is concerned with truth, the epistemic process is the same.

[14] It is for this reason any "well-developed epistemology" (including internalist, externalist, foundationalist, coherentist, etc.) can accept, as uncontroversial, a democratic theory built with these Peircean claims. (96)

[15] "Not all norms," Talisse writes, "are moral norms" and it is the epistemic norms that "pervade our cognitive lives, both individually and collectively." (55)

[16] Talisse writes, "Dewey has built into his conception of inquiry an entire system of philosophical commitments. The Deweyan characterization of inquiry presupposes, at the very least, a Darwinian conception of experience as the experimental activity of an organism within an environment, an ontology of 'situations' that admit of traits such as 'determinacy' and 'doubt,' and a metaphysics of objects of knowledge that emerge out of processes of inquiry." (18)

[17] Standard references to John Dewey's work are to the critical (print) edition, The Collected Works of John Dewey, 1882-1953, edited by Jo Ann Boydston (Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1969-1991), published in three series as The Early Works (EW), The Middle Works (MW) and The Later Works (LW). "LW5:270," for example, refers to The Later Works, volume 5, page 270.

[18] In "Fixation of Belief" doubt reminds Peirce of "the irritation of a nerve and the reflex action produced thereby" and he encapsulates "inquiry" in such terms: "The irritation of doubt causes a struggle to attain a state of belief. I shall term this struggle inquiry." [The Essential Peirce: Selected Philosophical Writings (1867-1893), ed. Nathan Houser and Christian J. W. Kloesel, (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1998), 114.] See, also, Murphey on Peirce's work with the naturalist principle of continuity in The Development of Peirce's Philosophy, Murray G. Murphey (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1993), 173.

[19] So, in "Search for the Great Community" Dewey writes,

Wherever there is conjoint activity whose consequences are appreciated as good by all singular persons who take part in it, and where the realization of the good is such as to effect an energetic desire and effort to sustain it in being just because it is a good shared by all, there is in so far a community. The clear consciousness of a communal life, in all its implications, constitutes the idea of democracy. (LW2:329, emphasis in original)

What stands out here is Dewey's recognition that democracy is not seeking to create one community at the expense of plural, many others. He is trying to show how the subsistence of community qua community is integral to the idea of democracy itself.

This connecting of democracy with community does not, by itself, prescribe a solution to particular antagonisms that are bound to arise between communal groups, but it implies Dewey had to believe such solutions were possible. If Talisse has a viable claim against Dewey on this issue, it is that Dewey was mistaken about his version of democracy's ability to solve such problems, but not that Dewey was offering an idea of democracy that was oppressive or conceptually tyrannical. See EW1:232, LW11:220 for other statements expressing Dewey's recognition of the pluralistic character of the contributions necessary to a democracy.

[20] See LW11:219 for Dewey's explicit condemnation of coercive methods of governance.

[21] In "Science, Belief, and the Public" Dewey argued vigorously for conditions -- both positive and negative -- amenable to full, free inquiry, writing that

Freedom of mind is not something that spontaneously happens. It is not achieved by the mere absence of obvious restraints. It is a product of constant, unremitting nurture of right habits of observation and reflection. Until the taboos that hedge social topics from contact with thought are removed, scientific method and results in subjects far removed from social themes will make little impression upon the public mind. Prejudice, fervor of emotion, bunkum, opinion and irrelevant argument will weigh as heavily as fact and knowledge. Intellectual confusion will continue to encourage the men who are intolerant and who fake their beliefs in the interests of their feelings and fancies. (MW15:52-53, my emphasis)

None of these points seem particularly normative; Dewey seems to be pressing the case here primarily for the epistemic conditions of inquiry. On the importance of free thought see, also, MW3:230.