A Realist Metaphysics of Race: A Context-Sensitive, Short-Term Retentionist, Long-Term Revisionist Approach

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Jeremy Pierce, A Realist Metaphysics of Race: A Context-Sensitive, Short-Term Retentionist, Long-Term Revisionist Approach, Lexington Books, 2015, 163pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739175606.

Reviewed by Dwayne A. Tunstall, Grand Valley State University


Jeremy Pierce applies "the fruits of philosophical work in contemporary [analytic] metaphysics and related disciplines" (xi) to his investigation of what races are and how racial classifications work. Those related disciplines include cognitive science, experimental philosophy, philosophy of biology, and philosophy of language. This investigation is an example of what he calls "applied metaphysics"(x).

Pierce first investigates what kinds of entities races are (chapters 1-6). This investigation leads him to adopt a realist metaphysics of race. In that metaphysics, races are not natural kinds, but are social kinds. Pierce then advocates a context-sensitive approach to racial classifications (chapter 7). He also argues for a short-term retentionist and long-term revisionist approach to the ethical and social issues involved in contemporary race relations (chapters 8-9).


In chapters 1-2, Pierce introduces the first main position one can take with respect to the metaphysics of race -- namely, that races are natural kinds. There is the classic racialist view of race, which which holds each race is comprised of individuals who are genetically similar. Further, because of the genetic similarity, members of a race share the same range of moral traits, behavioral dispositions, and emotional dispositions. They also share a distinctive culture, which differs from the cultures of other races. Pierce thinks that this view is easily refuted by both contemporary scientists and anti-realists.

Pierce holds that a more plausible version of the natural kind position is a minimalist view in which "natural kinds [are] whatever kinds are useful in certain ways in natural science, i.e., whichever groups of things could provide the best explanation for empirical data" (3). In this case, minimalist views of race would be ones where "races" function as useful biological concepts for biomedical research and scientific classification of humans. The minimalist views of race include cladistic minimalism, founder population minimalism as advanced by Philip Kitcher (at least as of 1999), and ancestry marker minimalism. Pierce thinks that all minimalist natural kind views of race are problematic because their proponents presume that scientific concepts of race either corresponds to or will someday correspond to our everyday use of racial terms. This presumption is a mistaken one according to Pierce. He contends that scientific classifications of race cannot provide us with adequate data for determining the meaning of our everyday racial terms and how racial classifications work (see 22-23).

In chapters 3-4, Pierce explains the second position one can take with respect to metaphysics of race. This position is race anti-realism. Proponents of race anti-realism contend that races don't exist. There are two general race anti-realism views: classic anti-realism and Joshua Glasgow's contemporary race anti-realism.

Pierce discusses the problems with classic race anti-realism in chapter 3. This version of race anti-realism originates from Kwame Anthony Appiah's writings on race from the 1980s and has been advanced prominently by Naomi Zack since the early 1990s. He contends that neither Zack's nor Appiah's version of classic race anti-realism can provide us with adequate arguments to support the contention that races do not exist. The argument from vagueness that Zack uses to support her race anti-realism is undermined by the available ways of handling vagueness in the philosophical literature (38). Appiah's referential argument against the existence of race depends on the questionable assumption that our everyday racial terms can refer only to natural kinds of the classic racialist variety. Once we reject the idea that races must refer to natural kinds of the classic racialist variety, Appiah's referential argument begs the question (41).

After Pierce identifies the inadequacies of classic race anti-realism, he examines the second anti-realism view in chapter 4: Glasgow's contemporary race anti-realism. Glasgow's race anti-realism is an advance over earlier classic race anti-realist views because Glasgow formulates a concept of race that approximates our everyday use of racial language. Glasgow's concept of race is a thin concept, which only requires one to conceive of a race as a group of individuals "distinguished by certain observable physical traits" and "[come] from a specific geographical region" (46). Pierce thinks that Glasgow's thin concept of race is a plausible way of accounting for the results of studies from experimental philosophy, cognitive science, and by more traditional thought experiments. Yet, Pierce and Glasgow disagree over whether "races" as we ordinarily talk about them actually exist. Glasgow contends that our ordinary race concepts have no referents (55); there are just groups of people who are mistakenly called races. Pierce, on the other hand, thinks that our ordinary race concepts refer to existent groups of people (60-61). He also thinks that Glasgow's race anti-realism provides the resources for a realist concept of race.

In chapters 5-6, Pierce discusses the third position one can take with respect to the metaphysics of race -- namely, that races are social kinds. In chapter 5 he explains what it means for races to be social kinds, whereas in chapter 6 he rejects what he calls the race-generating social-construction view of race. Proponents of the race-generating social-construction view contend that arbitrary and contingent social practices and social facts bring racial groups into existence (94). For Pierce this view ignores the fact that the groups we classify as races pre-existed the criteria people use to classify certain physical characteristics shared by members of a group as being socially salient and morally relevant. The physical characteristics shared by individuals are not created by social practices and social facts. Social practices just pick out certain physical characteristics belonging to a set of individuals and give those characteristics social salience and moral relevance. Ontologically speaking, racial groups are like any other set of individuals who share some common physical characteristics. It just so happens that the physical characteristics shared by individuals belonging to the same racial group are socially salient in a way that attached earlobes are not socially salient for the set of individuals who possess them (91). He calls his own realist view the pre-existing group social-construction view of race (129).

In chapter 7 Pierce explores the implications of his realist metaphysics of race on how we understand racial classifications. For him racial classifications are context-sensitive ways of classifying people racially. This means that the criteria for determining someone's racial identity vary depending on the context used to evaluate that person's racial identity. He provides several examples to illustrate the context-sensitivity of racial classifications, including the controversy over the appropriate racial terms to use when discussing then U.S. Senator Barack Obama's racial identity during his first presidential campaign. In President Obama's case, one can classify him (a) as racially black using the one-drop rule as it operated in the U.S. from the mid-19th century through the 20th century; (b) as brown, or of mixed-ancestry, using the racial classificatory criteria operative in some Latin American and Caribbean countries; or (c) as someone of "mixed-race" using more recent racial classificatory criteria in the U.S.

Perhaps the clearest example Pierce gives of the context-sensitive nature of racial classifications appears in chapter 4. There he briefly discusses three contexts we could use to determine St. Augustine's racial identity (66). In the first context discussed by Pierce, Augustine would not have been considered mixed race during his own time because the modern racial classificatory criteria wasn't operative at that time. In the second context discussed by Pierce, Augustine would have likely been considered black during the Jim Crow era in the U.S., given the racial classificatory criteria people used during that era. In the third context discussed by Pierce, Augustine would probably be considered someone of mixed race in the U.S. today. What we should note is that each one of these contexts provides the specific set of criteria we should use when evaluating which racial terms, if any, would apply to Augustine.

Once we have determined the nature of races and how racial classifications work, Pierce thinks that we are still left with the ethical question: Should we continue to use racial language to classify people given its problematic origins and its history of detrimentally affecting particular race groups? He thinks that there are three general answers to this question. One can be a retentionist who believes that we should retain our current racial categories, a revisionist who seeks to transform our current racial categories, or an eliminativist who "seek[s] to eliminate any thought, language, or practices that involve race" (117). Given the ongoing racial disparities in educational attainment, mortality rates, wealth, and incarceration rates between blacks and whites, he thinks that we should retain our current racial categories in the short term to address these disparities (145). Yet, he believes that we should work to gradually transform our racial categories to remove their problematic aspects, while retaining their unproblematic aspects. Hopefully, our revisions of racial categories will create the conditions for our descendants to live in a world where they no longer associate certain groups with negative stereotypes (145).

Pierce ends by acknowledging that a work of applied metaphysics isn't the place to delve into the ethical and social implications of his realist metaphysics of race for debates of affirmative action policies, identity politics, and color blindness (147-48). He also acknowledges that he has taken the black-white binary to be the dominant paradigm for discussing racial categories and classifications. This is in part because the literature on race he responds to presumes that binary is the paradigmatic example of ethnic and racial relations in the U.S. This is also in part because that binary simplifies issues so that scholars can better handle questions about the nature of race and racial classifications (149).


Even though A Realist Metaphysics of Race does not explore racial classifications much beyond the black-white binary, Pierce occasionally discusses how more recent ways of classifying people racially are incompatible with the one-drop rule and that rule's dependence on a clear-cut U.S. black-white binary. At various points, he discusses several studies conducted in psychology and experimental philosophy concerning how most people in the U.S. would classify someone who is of mixed-ancestry. According to Pierce's interpretation of these studies, a plurality of people today would not use the one-drop rule to determine the racial identity of someone who is mixed-ancestry. Nor does he think that a plurality of people today would use ancestry as the main criterion for determining someone's racial identity. Rather, someone's physical appearance is most likely to function as the main criterion many people use to determine a person's racial identity.

I am willing to concede that many people would not consider the one-drop rule or ancestry to be the main way for determining someone's racial identity in the early 21st century. Nevertheless, we still would be left with an important question concerning the ethical and social implications of physical appearance being the main criterion for determining someone's racial identity in the U.S. and other societies with a history of unjustly discriminating against racially black individuals. Can this shift in how people are racially classified lead to a gradual revision of U.S. racial categories that would improve how people view and treat the most socially subordinate racial groups in the U.S.?

Pierce is cautiously optimist about the possibility of such revisionism, at least for future generations. Yet, if he is right that physical appearance is the main criterion people use for classifying people racially today, then his optimism might be misplaced. There is a very real possibility that replacing the black-white binary with a more fluid racial continuum could still leave the lived experiences of most, if not all, racially black individuals roughly the same. Those individuals would likely have higher infant mortality rates, higher unemployment rates, higher incarceration rates, and less wealth than racially white individuals. The same would likely be true when comparing racially black individuals with members of most other non-white groups. Classifying people as mixed-race in such an environment would probably not lead to gradual improvements of the material conditions for most racially black individuals. Expanding the mixed-race category could actually further stigmatize people who cannot be classified as anything other than being racially black.[1] I fear that replacing the U.S. one-drop rule with a more fluid racial classificatory system could result in a society that not only fails to lessen the detrimental effects of anti-black social practices and governmental policies on racially black individuals, especially poor and working class black individuals, but might also be used to reinforce white (color) dominance in U.S. society.[2]

Despite my reservations about the prospects of long-term revisionism in improving the conditions of racially black individuals in the U.S., I respect Pierce for hoping that future generations can accomplish some measure of racial justice.


I would recommend this book to analytic metaphysicians, philosophers of race, philosophers of biology, philosophers of language, and anyone else who might be interested in how contemporary analytic metaphysics can help us conceive of race and how racial classifications work. Those who are not particularly interested in contemporary analytic metaphysics, philosophy of biology, philosophy of race, or the semantics of racial language may still want to read this book. Pierce's philosophical prose gracefully weaves together such apparently disparate topics as a charitable yet critical evaluation of minimalist natural kind views of race (chapter 2), a discussion of recent literature on metaphysical vagueness (33-38), a brief criticism of mereological nihilism (95), and suggestions from the implicit bias literature on how people can lessen the effects of implicit biases in their interactions with members of groups they are unconsciously biased against (144-45).

[1] See, for example, Lewis R. Gordon, Her Majesty's Other Children: Sketches of Racism from a Neocolonial Age (Landham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997), chapter 3.

[2] See Ian Haney López, White by Law: The Legal Construction of Race, 10th anniversary ed. (New York, NY: New York University Press, 2006), xviii and chapter 8.