A Structural Account of Mathematics

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Charles S. Chihara, A Structural Account of Mathematics, Oxford University Press, 2004, 320pp, $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199267537.

Reviewed by Colin McLarty, Case Western Reserve University


This terrific contribution will promote discussion for and against its views. It has unusually full discussion of what makes ’philosophy’ of mathematics. It engages in extensive debates with other philosophers. And it has a wide range of examples from pure and applied mathematics.1

Philosophy of mathematics is much occupied lately by structuralism, though with small agreement on what structures are or on the stakes for any given answer. Michael Resnik wants to take mathematical statements “at face value’‘ seeing that “for some time mathematicians have emphasized that mathematics is concerned with structures involving mathematical objects and not with the ’internal’ nature of the objects’‘ [24, p. 529]. Paul Benacerraf took his lead from set theory. Numbers as usually construed lack the properties of Zermelo-Fraenkel (ZF) sets and so cannot be sets according to Benacerraf [3]. He asked for a theory of structures on ZF foundations:

numbers are not objects at all, because in giving the properties (that is, necessary and sufficient) of numbers you merely characterize an abstract structure—and the distinction lies in the fact that the “elements’‘ of the structure have no properties other than those relating them to other “elements’‘ of the same structure. [3, p. 70]

So relations like 2+2 = 4 and 3-5 ≠ 12 are the only properties of numbers.2

Chihara earlier offered “a new system of mathematics that did not make reference to, or presuppose, mathematical objects’‘ (p. vii, referring to [6]). This book uses that system but focuses on philosophical argument and analysis of “mathematical systems currently used by scientists to show how such systems are compatible with a nominalistic outlook’‘ (p. vii). Chihara’s nominalism was never hermeneutical.3 It is not an account of what mathematicians intend. He only argues that the structural content of mathematics can be construed in nominalist terms, without taking structures as objects.

Philosophy is identified as seeking “the Big Picture’‘ (pp. 1ff.). In contrast “some philosophers of mathematics make no attempt to understand our actual mathematical practices’‘ but focus on technicalities and make up new ways to do mathematics, such as “L.E.J. Brouwer, Hermann Weyl, and Arend Heyting’‘ (p. 4). This valuable philosophic perspective would be more valuable if it drew on more accurate history. No one living today publishes such broadly philosophic work on the Big Picture in mathematics as Weyl’s Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science [31, 33]. No one today goes as deeply into the philosophy of actual practice as Weyl in many works including his Symmetry [34] and his famous books on relativity and quantum theory [30, 32] (and see [25]). He quickly found intuitionism unworkable but never gave up the values that drew him to it. His conception of mathematics has vast influence on practice to this day.

Brouwer was immersed in practice before David Hilbert’s style was established. As a student around 1907 he avidly absorbed all that Hilbert and Henri Poincaré wrote on the foundations of mathematics while the new style was being created. He was the leading topologist of the 1910s and early 1920s. His intuitionism was one great mathematician’s part in the live debate over how mathematics would be done. It displayed no lack of interest in actual practice.

Chihara draws on the extensive debate over proof in [1, 15, 16, 29]. This is a welcome improvement over the idea that good, practical-minded mathematicians never worry about philosophy. Mathematicians often talk and write about foundations and philosophic issues, and philosophers too rarely engage with them. He cites partly unpublished realist and anti-realist views from nine logicians and set theorists known to him (p. 11). He quotes Poincaré, Hilbert, and Bernays saying that existence in mathematics means only consistency, and cites Georg Cantor also to this effect (pp. 17ff.). Chihara takes this as an anti-realist view.

Others would argue that if existence in mathematics means consistency, and set theory really is consistent, then sets really exist. See for example [2] and Chihara’s discussion of it. Richard Dedekind took consistency as the only limit on our ability to posit real existence in mathematics when he wrote: “We are of a god-like race and beyond any doubt have the power to create not only material things (railroads, telegraphs) but most especially things of the mind’‘ [9, vol. 3, p. 489].

Philosophers ask some questions that Chihara thinks “most mathematicians’‘ do not, notably whether mathematical objects have any properties beyond structural ones (p. 50). But in fact mathematicians ask this too. Cantor stressed how the elements of his “cardinal numbers’‘ are “mere units’‘ with no distinguishing properties [5, pp. 282--83]. William Lawvere’s categorical set theory agrees with Cantor on this [19]. Two prominent mathematicians have separately told me “there is no ontology’‘ in the theory of schemes, the spaces of today’s algebraic geometry. They meant that schemes really do not even have all the properties explicitly attributed to them in the definitions.4 Only the geometric relations are real. And an assistant professor of mathematics once urged me to tell philosophers that “when we talk about things they only have the properties we say they do’‘.

The book stands out for broad engagement with current philosophers. Discussion of Peter van Inwagen draws on more of current metaphysics than philosophers of mathematics usually do (pp. 19ff.). There are extensive references to Mark Balaguer, Burgess, Hartry Field, Geoffrey Hellman, Penelope Maddy, Resnik, and Stewart Shapiro, and especially long debates with Resnik and Shapiro.

Rather than say various mathematical objects exist, Chihara’s constructibility theory says “it is possible to construct’‘ various sentences which might seem to describe those objects—but do not truly refer to anything (170). As to the “possible’‘ constructions of sentences he says:

The possibility talked about in the Constructibility Theory is what is called `conceptual’ or `broadly logical’ possibility—a kind of metaphysical possibility, in so far as it is concerned with how the world could have been (p. 171, Chihara’s emphasis)

It need not be humanly or physically possible to write these sentences. They are of all finite lengths, and in effect the theory claims as much freedom of movement in mathematics as simple type theory. For example, it accommodates the axiom of choice hypothetically. Theorems which would require choice are proved here as hypotheticals: ’if the axiom of choice holds then certain sentences will be constructible’. So it affirms the hypothetical constructibility of sentences which no one will ever know how to write (191, compare 171).

An exemplary passage debates Shapiro’s claim that “Chihara’s system is a notational variant of simple type theory… [and] cannot claim an epistemological advantage’‘ [27, p. 231], quoted on Chihara p. 185. I was very sympathetic to Shapiro’s claim and still am. And Chihara gives many quotes to spell out Shapiro’s case. But he also points out clear problems. Shapiro claims simple type theory and constructibilty theory say the same things in this sense: they can be translated into each other so as to “preserve warranted belief, at least, and probably truth” [26, p. 457]. Chihara argues, though, that different construals of type theory make different epistemological claims. Even homophony does not guarantee epistemological equivalence (188ff.). He also argues that preserving ’warranted belief’ does not guarantee preserving the warrants offered for the beliefs, and that is the epistemological question (194). It is a well run debate and left me less certain than I was before. The book offers many such debates.

Much of the book looks at applications of mathematics. These are a natural strength of structuralism. Clearly when a painter calculates how many gallons a job will need, a physicist calculates energy eigenvalues of some atom, or a geometer applies analysis, the ontology of numbers is not at stake. Only their structure is. Chihara looks at the conceptual issues with much discussion of other philosophers.

The book is a great essay at bringing real mathematics into philosophy. The discussion of Andrew Wiles’ proof of Fermat’s Last Theorem shows some ways that it could and should go much further. Among the “many aspects of Wiles’ proof that may puzzle philosophers’‘ Chihara focuses on one: “why were investigations into the nature of such conceptually complicated mathematical entities as modular forms in hyperbolic space needed’‘ in arithmetic (p. 258)? Yet his proffered answer (p. 259) is a comparison to a proof of the Pythagorean theorem which may go back to ancient Greece and is known from the Indian mathematician Bhaskara circa 1150 AD [13, vol. 1, p. 355]. This is little to the point of Wiles’ proof.

In fact “complication’‘ is a red herring. Higher analysis often simplifies proofs even when more elementary proofs (in the logician’s sense of ’elementary’) are known. It simplified Wiles’ proof to the extent of making it possible instead of impossible. The interesting question is: why would something as apparently remote from arithmetic as analysis on the complex numbers simplify arithmetic?

Some uses of complex numbers in number theory are unmysterious. For example, which prime numbers p are sums of squares of natural numbers, so that p = a 2+b 2? One approach uses Gaussian integers which are complex numbers a+bi with a,b integers and i 2 = -1. Then the right hand side factors so that p = (a+bi)(a-bi). Rules for factoring Gaussian integers show the equation has a solution if and only if p equals 2 or equals 4n+1 for some integer n. Even i 2 = -1 can be seen as mere notation. We can as well define a Gaussian integer as an ordered pair (a,b) of ordinary integers, with addition and multiplication of pairs given by

(a,b)+(a’,b’) = (a+a’,b+b’) and (a,b)(a’,b’)=(aa’-bb’,ab’+a’b)

There is no mystery in this calculational system—or, rather, none that is not already in ordinary arithmetic.

The mystery is the power of complex analysis in number theory. For example Leonhard Euler (1707-1783) found:

∞ Σ 1/n2 = π2/6 n=1

Chihara discusses this briefly on pp. 310ff. Details are in George Pólya’s classic of historical philosophy of mathematics [23, vol. 1, pp. 17ff.]. Euler saw the sum as the value for s = 2 of the zeta function:

∞ zeta (s) = Σ 1/n2 so that zeta (2) = π2/6 n=1

He used this function to show that the prime numbers are fairly dense among all natural numbers. Specifically, he showed that the sum of the inverse primes is infinite, so that for example the primes are infinitely denser than the squares, since the sum of inverse squares converges. See [11, chap.1].

Georg Bernhard Riemann around 1859 showed by complex analysis that zeta (s) is uniquely defined for any complex number s ≠ 1 although the infinite sum only works when the real part of s is greater than 1. Thus he came to the (still unproved) Riemann hypothesis with all its consequences for arithmetic. Serious complex analysis is applied to zeta and related functions throughout number theory. See various chapters throughout [14]. This is well popularized in [10]. To eliminate it would take far more than notational change. The logic of these proofs is well understood. Their efficacy and practical indispensability remain astonishing.

This is a good philosophical issue but Chihara does not tell of the known leads. The theory of generating functions depicts Euler’s zeta function as a summary of infinitely many finitary combinatoric facts, and similarly for other complex analytic functions in number theory [35]. Do generating functions solve the mystery or deepen it? Another view emphasizes how complex analytic functions (such as the modular functions Wiles uses) figure in systems with useful symmetries and in effect give useful group representations. (See [21] for an introduction.) This is a huge and exploding field— see for example all references to the Langlands program in [8]. And this is no new puzzle. The complex analytic methods are centuries old.

The late 20th century novelty is the reliance on categories and functors, the basic tools of working structuralism in mathematics today. Diophantine equations are the search for integer solutions to integer polynomials such as the Fermat equation Xn+Yn = Zn. At a conference on Wiles’ proof, number theorist Hendrik Lenstra “recounted that twenty years ago he was firm in his conviction that he DID want to solve Diophantine equations, and that he DID NOT wish to represent functors—and now he is amused to discover himself representing functors in order to solve Diophantine equations!’‘ [20, p. 245].5 Why is this? And what does it say about structuralism?


1. Atiyah, M., Responses to: A. Jaffe and F. Quinn, `Theoretical mathematics: toward a cultural synthesis of mathematics and theoretical physics’. Bulletin of the American Mathematical Society, 1994. 30: p. 178--207.

2. Balaguer, M., Platonism and anti-Platonism in Mathematics. 1998: Oxford University.

3. Benacerraf, P., What numbers could not be. Philosophical Review, 1965. 74: p. 47--73.

4. Burgess, J., Why I am not a nominalist. Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 1983. 24: p. 93--105.

5. Cantor, G., Gesammelte Abhandlungen mathematischen und philosophischen Inhalts. 1932, Berlin: Julius Springer.

6. Chihara, C., Constructibility and Mathematical Existence. 1990: Oxford University.

7. Corfield, D., Towards a Philosophy of Real Mathematics. 2003: Cambridge University.

8. Cornell, G., J. Silverman, and G. Stevens, Modular Forms and Fermat’s Last Theorem. 1997: Springer-Verlag.

9. Dedekind, R., Gesammelte mathematische Werke. 1930-1932, Braunschweig: Friedr. Vieweg & Sohn.

10. Du Sautoy, M., The Music of the Primes: Searching to Solve the Greatest Mystery in Mathematics. 2003, New York: Harper Collins.

11. Edwards, H., Riemann’s Zeta Function. 1974, New York: Academic Press.

12. Eisenbud, D. and J. Harris, The Geometry of Schemes. 2000: Springer-Verlag.

13. Heath, T., The Thirteen Books of Euclid’s Elements. 1956: Dover Publishing.

14. Ireland, K. and M. Rosen, A Classical Introduction to Modern Number Theory. 1992: Springer-Verlag.

15. Jaffe, A. and F. Quinn, “Theoretical mathematics”: toward a cultural synthesis of mathematics and theoretical physics. Bulletin of the American Mathematical Society, 1993. 29: p. 1-13.

16. Jaffe, A. and F. Quinn, Response to: “Responses to: A. Jaffe and F. Quinn, `Theoretical mathematics: toward a cultural synthesis of mathematics and theoretical physics’ ‘‘. Bulletin of the American Mathematical Society, 1994. 30: p. 208--11.

17. Krieger, M., Doing Mathematics. 2003, London: World Scientific.

18. Lawvere, F.W., An elementary theory of the category of sets. Proceedings of the National Academy of Science of the U.S.A., 1964. 52: p. 1506--1511.

19. Lawvere, F.W., Cohesive toposes and Cantor’s “lauter Einsen”. Philosophia Mathematica, 1994. 2: p. 5--15.

20. Mazur, B., Introduction to the deformation theory of Galois representations, in Modular Forms and Fermat’s Last Theorem, G. Cornell, J. Silverman, and S. Stevens, Editors. 1997, Springer-Verlag. p. 243--312.

21. McKean, H. and V. Moll, Elliptic Curves: Function Theory, Geometry, Arithmetic. 1999: Cambridge University.

22. McLarty, C., Numbers can be just what they have to. Noûs, 1993. 27: p. 487--98.

23. Pólya, G., Mathematics and plausible reasoning. 1990: Princeton University.

24. Resnik, M., Mathematics as a science of patterns: Ontology and reference. Noûs, 1981. 15: p. 529--50.

25. Scholz, E., Hermann Weyl’s Raum-Zeit-Materie, and a General Introduction to his Scientific Work. 2001, Basel: Birkhäuser.

26. Shapiro, S., Modality and ontology. Mind, 1993. 102: p. 455--81.

27. Shapiro, S., Philosophy of Mathematics: Structure and Ontology. 1997: Oxford University.

28. Stevens, G., An overview of the proof of Fermat’s last theorem, in Modular Forms and Fermat’s Last Theorem, G. Cornell, J. Silverman, and S. Stevens, Editors. 1997, Springer-Verlag. p. 1--16.

29. Thurston, W.P., On proof and progress in mathematics. Bulletin of the American Mathematical Society, 1994. 30: p. 161--177.

30. Weyl, H., Raum, Zeit, Materie. Vorlesungen über allgemeine Relativitätstheorie. 1919, Berlin: J. Springer.

31. Weyl, H., Philosophie der Mathematik und Naturwissenschaft. 1927, Munich: R. Oldenbourg.

32. Weyl, H., Gruppentheorie und Quantenmechanik. 1928, Leipzig: S. Hirzel.

33. Weyl, H., Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science. 1949: Princeton University.

34. Weyl, H., Symmetry. 1952: Princeton University.

35. Wilf, H., Generatingfunctionology. 1994, Boston: Academic Press.


1. Wider ranges are treated philosophically in [7] and [17].

2. The sets of categorical set theory are abstract structures in Benacerraf's sense. An element of a categorical set has no properties other than its relations to other elements of that set. Categorical set theory does not meet Benacerraf's goal for a theory of structures, though, because it is not based on ZF foundations. See [18], [22].

3. Chihara cites Burgess [4] for naming hermeneutical nominalism (p. 154-168).

4. On one definition schemes are topological spaces with structure sheaves, while another makes them functors on categories of rings [12, pp. 18 and 252]. The two produce equivalent categories of schemes-i.e. they give the same geometrical relations. The mathematicians were warning me that neither definition is ontologically true.

5. Wiles' proof pivots on deformation of Galois representations [pp. 10-13][28]. Barry Mazur's proof of the relevant facts on those is "all about functors'' [20. p. 245] and so he quotes Lenstra.