A Study of Dialectic in Plato's Parmenides

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Eric Sanday, A Study of Dialectic in Plato's Parmenides, Northwestern University Press, 2015, 228pp., $79.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780810130074.

Reviewed by Blake Hestir, Texas Christian University


Eric Sanday's book is an intriguing monograph with a distinctly challenging, tripartite thesis: Plato's Theory of Forms is true, easy to understand, and relatively intuitive­­. He locates the evidence for his view in the notoriously obscure yet fascinating dialectical exchange in the latter part of the Parmenides, where he finds Parmenides exemplifying the tools required for resolving the puzzles about the Theory of Forms raised earlier in his conversation with Socrates.

Sanday argues that by dialectical exercise (on his view as a type of education [79]) and the introduction of scientific philosophy, the Parmenides reveals the "priority of the sources of intelligibility over individual things" (5). What has steered us away from the truth is an implicit metaphysical assumption that privileges individual things over the conditions for their being as they are. Such privileging has a distorting effect on our understanding (or lack thereof) and ignores the ultimate sources and principles guiding our pursuit of material goods -- in other words, the perceptible things subject to becoming, particularly those of value to us -- yet it "fits neatly into the larger attitude according to which human subjectivity imposes meaning on things" (4).

Plato's resolution of this issue includes demonstrating that one must first clear away misconceptions about the nature of "is" (4) by means of dialectic, which is "the project of breaking down basic assumptions in order to recapture the animating source that lives at their core" (8). The lesson of the deductions in the second part of the Parmenides is that forms "enable the spatio-temporal presence of things" yet they retain a "self-concealing presence" that is prior to the perceptibles (174).

Sanday claims that the distinction between humans and the world is both a "threat and well-spring of philosophy" and should be approached in the "attitude of receptivity," where one should see intelligibility supplied by the practice of dialectic as a gift (6). The Parmenides creates "a space within which we can exercise away our dependencies on the spatio-temporal object and actively cultivate receptivity" to dialectic (6). So, he thinks, the Parmenides is more broadly a preliminary guide to the philosopher's new stances toward the study of goodness, justice, and beauty.

Not surprisingly, the book is divided into two sections that reflect the structure of the dialogue. The two chapters of Part I explain what Sanday means by scientific philosophy. Part II, "Exercise and Rehabilitation," covers the strategy of the Hypotheses (read: the deductions from hypotheses in the second part of the dialogue), with most attention paid to Hypotheses 1-2, which Sanday thinks set the stage for the rest. Chapter 1 provides a refreshing historical context for the conversation and introduces the metaphysical themes of the book. On Sanday's view, as a part of teaching dialectic, the dialogue forwards a critique of ordinary, everyday metaphysical assumptions wherein Socrates must "travel down the road of rhetoric and eristic" to detach himself from assuming that forms are fundamentally things (33).

In Chapter 2 Sanday provides even more detail about the nature of what he calls "scientific philosophy" by parsing Parmenides' objections to Socrates' account of forms and participation. So, for example, there is a discussion of part/whole complexity and compositionality, the regress arguments, forms as thoughts, and the greatest difficulty argument. The lesson Socrates must learn, and a lesson for all those training in dialectic, is (a) overcoming the object-paradigm that guides his thinking about the forms, and (b) developing a better account of what he means by participation (64).

Part II (chs. 3-5) opens with a detailed discussion of Hypotheses 1-2 (H1-2). Sanday covers a range of plausible meanings of the opening hypothesis 'ei hen estin' (137e4), which include (a) the one itself, (b) any form or cause itself insofar as it is one, (c) a weave into some unity of distinct forms, (d) a mathematical unity, (e) a continuum in which spatio-temporal individuals stand and take support, and (f) the "all" in which participant things are included (80). He settles with what he considers to be a weaker view that the "one" must refer to any individual just insofar as it is one, in other words, any one qua being one (80, 196 n. 29). This view, then, guides his interpretation of Parmenides' dialectical strategy.

Chapter 3 is a discussion of how the order and organization of the arguments point to a coherent set of metaphysical categories that prepare us to parse the "eidetic structure of the spatio-temporal one" (14). Aristotle's commitment to the being of this "one" constrains him to refer exclusively to the perceptibles or "ones" but in a way that demonstrates his commitment to a conception of being that is independent of space and time.

Chapter 4 takes up H2 that, like H1, is designed to reveal formal structure as a precondition of the perceptibles. The discussion of the addendum and Hypotheses 3-8 is relegated to the final chapter, "Transformed Perspective," and primarily focuses on the content of the addendum and H3, H5, and H7, which are cast as necessary consequences of the lessons learned from H2 and H3. Sanday argues that the notion of "the instant" (H2a [the addendum]), the idea of limit and the unlimited (H3), the idea of veridical predication (H5), and the idea of appearance (H7) necessarily follow from "the transformed understanding of the spatio-temporal 'one' arising from dialectical study" (15).

The book is for the most part well researched and takes into account some of the relevant scholarship. I found the central part the most interesting. Sanday compares the picture of dialectic in Republic VI-VII with the dialectical exchange in the second part of the Parmenides, particularly with respect to H1-H2. On his interpretation, if Socrates is to salvage (Ackrill [1955]; cf. Rickless [1998], [2007]) the Theory of Forms he must start with a critique of our ordinary metaphysical privileging of perceptibles in order to realize that the intelligibility of these things requires "timeless being that structures and conditions becoming" (101). Each deduction, then, presumably takes Aristotle one step closer to an understanding of the "distinct kinds" of "is" and "one" and their interrelation.

The Sun Analogy and Allegory of the Cave in the Republic, as well as the description of dialectic at the end of Republic VI as proceeding according to hypotheses, are where Sanday claims Socrates (a) makes metaphysical distinctions between forms and things (no surprise), (b) employs dialectic to articulate this division in "rigorously discursive terms," and (c) distinguishes unreflective inquiry from dialectical inquiry as, at best, a preparation for the discussion in the Parmenides. Here we find Plato offering a glimpse into the epistemological leap from the perceptibles to their intelligible conditions, which the Parmenides presents in more detail.

Whereas the study of dialectic in the Parmenides concerns what sort of object forms are, the Allegory of the Cave, for example, establishes by image that there are objects towards which dialectic is directed, but leaves open the possibility that the very notion of object that fuels one's anticipation of insight will require substantial critique. Mathematical studies are a preparatory for practicing dialectic and fall short of it by, for instance, remaining tied to the basic spatial and quantifiable structure of individuals.

The parallels here between the Republic and Parmenides are worth considering, and Sanday's development of his thesis in these chapters is certainly compelling, yet I was left wanting a more detailed parsing of the Republic passages and more development of the connections between the two dialogues, and perhaps even connections with the methodology of the Meno and Phaedo. But, that is perhaps another book.

I found the footnotes, where the reader will find practically all of the extensive scholarly controversy helpful. Although I appreciate confining the nuances of scholarly debate to footnotes, given the fact that some scholars see the various hypotheses as antinomies leading perhaps to nothing but aporia, it would have been interesting to read more about what reasons Sanday has for thinking that these interpretations fail. And there is little or no discussion of some helpful scholarly contributions on dialectic generally and the Parmenides specifically, including those of, for example, Hugh Benson, Mary Louise Gill, Sandra Petersen, and Sam Rickless. (In the case of Gill [2012], this is perhaps understandable given the publication dates.)

Moreover, Sanday's choice of a weaker interpretation of "the one" needs more defense. He sides with M. M. McCabe (1996), who stresses the abstract character of the exercises and moves away from thinking of the subject matter of Part II as carrying some sort of ontological commitment (196-98 nn. 25-29, and nn. 1-2; see too 87, and 80, 82, 197-98 nn 2, 6; and 184 n. 15 [on self-predication]). However, I think it important to emphasize that the dialectical exchange comes on the heels of a key point Parmenides makes to Socrates at 135b5­-c3:

[If] someone, having paid attention to all the present [difficulties] and others of the same sort, will not allow there to be forms of the things that are (eidê tôn ontôn) and will not mark off a form (horieitai eidos) for each one (henos hekastou), he will not have anywhere to turn his thought (dianoian), since he does not allow that for each of the things that are there is an idea that is always the same (idean tôn ontôn hekastou tên autên aei einai), and in this way he will destroy (diaphtherei; cf. Theatetus 157b1) the capacity for dialectic (as Sanday interprets 'dialegesthai') in every way (pantapasi). But I think you are well aware of that.

It is Socrates' forms, beings that by this point in the discussion must merely be one and the same in at least one respect that Parmenides has in mind when proceeding to the dialectical exercise with the one itself (tou henos autou, 137b3) as subject. So, it is not surprising that Parmenides should separate the one as the first being to interrogate in its sundry ways of being and not being. One might be inclined simply to put it this way: one is among those formal conditions necessary for the possibility of dialegesthai itself.

Sanday also claims that the reasons he provides in support of his overall interpretation of the Parmenides do not rest on any supposed chronology of the dialogues because "it will never be decided in what order Plato wrote the dialogues, and even if it were, nothing would follow from that order about the quality of character of the thought Plato would be obligated to have" (11). This blanket statement is unjustified. That some of the dialogues like the Timaeus and Cratylus are more difficult to date than others is no reason to suppose that the dialogues generally cannot be chronologically ordered. Perhaps this is a moot point anyway since Sanday's actual position here is that the Socratic conversations in other dialogues are "preparatory for the metaphysical analysis undertaken in the Parmenides" (7). For instance, he leans on the discussion of dialectic in Republic VI-VII and points out that the notion of "eidetic complex" (forms composed of forms) is taken up later in the Theaetetus and Sophist.

And speaking of the Sophist, if Sanday's rather optimistic reading of section two of the dialogue is correct, particularly the supposed insights into being, participation, and the Theory of Forms, then one wonders what exactly is happening in this dialogue. The Eleatic Stranger offers some insights into Plato's conception of the nature and mechanism of being and not being by appeal to the "very large" kinds, particularly in relation to what he refers to as the forms (toin eidoin, 255d4) "by virtue of itself" and "relative to others," both of which play an important role in the dialectical exercise in the Parmenides -- at least as some have argued. But none of this is by any means perspicuous. Furthermore, I found the discussion of veridical truth and veridical legein primarily found in H5 rather tough going. He thinks these notions involve what he calls the "motion of truth," but it is not clear that this idea, if I understand it correctly, fits well with the discussion of motion and rest in the Sophist (see 155, 159-56, 163-65). Maybe it need not, but I am still puzzled as to whether this is what Plato had in mind for motion in H5.

Finally, Sanday leans towards a dialogical reading of the text, by which he means this:

The [Platonic] text is effectively incomplete in such a way that it will not allow itself to remain unanswered. In the way a good conversation opens by inviting, sometimes demanding, a reply, the dialogues at various levels of depth and scope present themselves as not having said enough, requiring supplement, addition, or recapitulation. In this book I take the stance that the Platonic text will show us how it demands to be read. The truth that emerges from this dialogical reading practice will come as a slowly growing harmony arising between oneself, other people, the text, and the world around us (11).

This is a rather different way of reading the text from what some will be accustomed to, and in principle I have no objections to this approach provided that the interpretation forwards, in this case, one's understanding of Plato's methodology and metaphysics. To be sure, Sandy has made a worthy and interesting contribution to the scholarship on the Parmenides, but at the end of the day, I remain unconvinced that Plato's Theory of Forms is true, easy to understand, and relatively intuitive.


J. L. Ackrill, "ΣUΜΠΛΟΚΗ ΕΙΔΩΝ" (1955), in Ackrill, Essays on Plato and Aristotle (Clarendon Press, 1997), 72-79.

M. L. Gill, Philosophos: Plato's Missing Dialogue (Oxford University Press, 2012).

M. M. McCabe, "Unity in the Parmenides: The Unity of the Parmenides," in Form and Argument in Late Plato, ed. C. Gill and M. M. McCabe (Clarendon Press, 1996), 5-48.

S. Rickless, "How Parmenides Saved the Theory of Forms," Philosophical Review 107 (1998): 501-54.

--  --  --  --  -- Plato's Forms in Transition: A Reading of the Parmenides (Cambridge University Press, 2007).